The Mechanical World: The Metaphysical Commitments of the New Mechanistic Approach

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Beate Krickel, The Mechanical World: The Metaphysical Commitments of the New Mechanistic Approach, Springer, 2018, 163pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030036287.

Reviewed by Stuart Glennan, Butler University


Beate Krickel believes the New Mechanists need a new metaphysics, and her aim in this book is to provide it. The term "New Mechanism" refers to a body of literature that started in the 1990s and has since burgeoned, which takes mechanisms to be a central object of inquiry and which uses the language of mechanisms to recast many traditional topics in philosophy of science, e.g., discovery, theories and models, reduction, and explanation (Craver and Tabery 2016; Glennan and Illari 2017). The philosophical reorientation advised by New Mechanism was born of a concern with scientific practice and a hope for a philosophical vocabulary more adequate to describing and explaining the actual activities and products of science. But despite its origin in scientific practice, the New Mechanism touches on issues that traditionally fall within ontology and metaphysics -- issues like the nature of objects and processes and of causation and composition.

Krickel argues with some justice that some tidying up is necessary. There are multiple not obviously compatible sets of metaphysical assumptions to be found in the literature, and there is a persistent tendency to conflate metaphysical and methodological issues. Her aim then is to offer a coherent and explicit metaphysical account that harmonizes with and explains the features of mechanistic science that have been the focus of research by New Mechanists. She focuses especially on the following questions:

  • What are mechanisms? What are their defining features?
  • What are major different categories of mechanisms?
  • What are the defining features of the various constituents of mechanisms -- notably what are entities, activities and phenomena?
  • What is causal production and causal relevance, and how are these notions related to mechanisms?
  • What makes it the case that some component is constitutively (as opposed to causally) relevant to mechanisms?

These questions are not original to Krickel. She draws them from canonical papers and books in the literature (e.g., Glennan 1996; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000; Craver 2007; Illari and Williamson 2012). Her aim is to provide answers to these questions that review, refine and integrate these debates.

Krickel's strategy has the benefit of directly engaging questions in the literature, but it also accounts for some of the book's limitations. The book is written primarily for insiders, assuming material with relatively little exposition and quickly moving between the stock of examples that frequent the literature. Moreover, it delves only in passing into the relation of New Mechanism to other metaphysical accounts on offer -- for instance process theories, structural realism, causal powers accounts, or accounts based on laws of nature. Finally, there is, beyond the bare thought that New Mechanism needs metaphysics, little in the way of a unifying arc. The chapters read not as part of a single story, but as some connected bits of puzzle solving. Some of the puzzle solving is quite good, though, and those who know these debates will find ideas worthy of reflection.

Let me turn to a summary of some of the highlights of the chapters. Chapter 2 is a survey of theories of mechanism. After a brief discussion of the not-yet-New Mechanism of Salmon and Dowe, Krickel distinguishes two competing analyses of mechanism, the complex systems account, which she attributes to Bechtel and Richardson (1993), Glennan (1996), and Cartwright (1999), among others, and the acting entities approach, which she attributes especially to Machamer, Darden and Craver (2000). The idea is that, on the complex systems account, a mechanism is a composite entity that acts, or is disposed to act, by the activities of its parts, while on the acting entities approach, the mechanism is just the process that is composed of those activities. So, on the former approach, the heart is a mechanism that pumps blood, while, on the latter, the mechanism is the heart's pumping. There is an ontologically significant distinction to be had here, but Krickel's exposition makes it seem like there is more of a debate between two rival conceptions than there actually is. What we have here is two different senses of the term 'mechanism.' We can call a heart a mechanism, because it is a system that pumps, or we can call the heart's pumping a mechanism because the heart's parts engage in activities which collectively are pumping. It is a mistake, though, to attribute to the so-called complex systems theorists a lack of concern for activities and processes, since they universally acknowledge that what makes a system mechanism a mechanism is the processes that go on in that system that are responsible for the mechanism's phenomenon. What Krickel might more charitably have argued for is that, for the purposes of a metaphysical characterization, the acting entities sense of mechanism is primary. This primacy follows from an asymmetry first pointed out in (Glennan 2002), that any mechanistic system has mechanistic processes that do or can occur in it, but some mechanistic processes occur outside the context of mechanistic systems.

Also in Chapter 2, Krickel introduces a distinction that will matter for the rest of her account -- the distinction between etiological and constitutive mechanisms. While Salmon and Craver used these terms to highlight different aspects of explanation, Krickel (rightly I think) argues that this marks an ontological distinction between kinds of mechanisms. Etiological mechanisms produce some phenomenon, so the phenomenon occurs as a result of a mechanism; constitutive mechanisms are mechanisms "within" the explanandum, where the organized activities of parts underlie the mechanism's phenomenon. The former are described in etiological explanations, while the latter are described in constitutive explanations.

Chapter 3 discusses the ways in which mechanisms are or are not regular, and the relation of mechanisms to functions. There is a large literature on both of these topics, and this chapter does not seem to me to advance the debate. Probably the most interesting thing in it occurs in the footnotes, where Krickel announces her nominalism about mechanism types. In her view, mechanisms are concrete particulars, and this is where the metaphysical action is. This is an attractive but provocative view, and Krickel's book would have benefited by foregrounding and defending this claim and its implications.[1]

Chapter 4, which discusses the entity-activity dualism introduced originally by (Machamer, Darden, and Craver (hereafter MDC), contains some of the most significant new ideas in the book. To start, Krickel argues that the metaphysically central unit of analysis for mechanisms should be what she calls an entity-involving-occurrent (EIO). Her account draws on the metaphysical distinction between continuants and occurrents. She follows MDC in using the term 'entity' to refer to (generally compound) objects or system (cells, hearts, cars, etc.). These entities are paradigm examples of continuants -- things that endure and are wholly present over time. Occurrents, by contrast, are things like processes or events that have beginnings, ends, and other temporal parts. MDC's category of activities are part of the broader class of occurrents. Krickel's idea, originally from (Kaiser and Krickel 2017), is that the components of mechanisms can include acting entities, but also entities that are passive, or which maintain states. All of these count as EIOs. Using EIOs as the central unit of analysis, Krickel offers an account of the nature and kinds of activities, and of what it is for one EIO to cause another. A common criticism of MDC's account of activities is that it was all slogans and there was little by way of a general characterization of what activities were or how they could productively engage in causation, and Krickel has made some real progress in filling this gap.

While this work will be of help to someone already committed to activities, the more skeptical may not be persuaded. For instance, friends of event-based conceptions could conceive of activities as being reducible to event sequences, and Krickel has offered no argument against such a move. Further, while she insists on the priority of activities over capacities, Krickel has more or less accepted without argument the slogans from MDC; she could spend much more time than she does to explain how friends of activities should interpret capacity talk in the sciences.

Chapters 5-7 seek to use the metaphysical apparatus introduced in Chapter 4 to address some much discussed topics in the mechanisms literature -- the nature of mechanistic phenomena, the relation between causation and constitution in mechanisms, and the role of levels in mechanisms. The general strategy is conservative. Krickel starts with standard theories (like Craver's mutual manipulability theory for constitutive relevance), and tinkers with them to help solve problems that have been raised for those theories.

Perhaps the most surprising claim Krickel makes in these chapters is that mechanistic constitution, which she takes to be "the metaphysical connection between the mechanism and the phenomenon" (p. 135), is a metaphysically primitive necessitation relation:

Whether any complex EIO constitutes another EIO of which it is a spatial EIO-part is a brute fact about that complex EIO. . . . The difference between my muscle's contracting and the blood's circulating through my arm's veins that makes the former a constituent of my arm's bending but the latter only a mere spatial EIO part of it, is that my muscle's contracting is an EIO that, in the right circumstances, constitute my arm's bending. (p. 149)

This is a striking (and largely unargued for) claim that seems at odds with her subsequent assertion that whether something is a constituent of some phenomenon can be identified by means of ideal interventions. Does not the fact that interventions give a handle on constituent relations suggest that the constitution relation is not primitive, but depends in some way on causal relations that experiments normally are taken to identify?

The book closes with a final chapter titled "Autonomy, Laws of Nature, and the Mind-Body Problem" that turns to applications of the metaphysical framework of New Mechanism to some traditional debates in philosophy of science and philosophy of mind. Unfortunately, the discussion of these topics is extremely brief (a mere four and one half pages), and constitute, as Krickel admits, only a sketch of issues for future research. Given that this book is part of a series on Mind and Brain, one would like much more here.

Krickel's book is well-researched, and provides both a valuable summary of and some interesting suggestions regarding metaphysical debates within the mechanisms literature. Where it sometimes falls short is in showing us why we should care about these debates. My hope for Krickel and like-minded researchers is that they will make use of this framework to confront more extensively some sometimes moribund metaphysical debates in the metaphysics of science and the philosophy of mind.


Thanks to Ken Aizawa for comments on an earlier version of this review.


Bechtel, William, and Robert C Richardson. 1993. Discovering Complexity: Decomposition and Localization as Strategies in Scientific Research. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Cartwright, Nancy. 1999. The Dappled World: A Study of the Boundaries of Science. Cambridge, U.K.; New York: Cambridge University Press.

Craver, Carl F. 2007. Explaining the Brain. Oxford: Oxord University Press.

Craver, Carl F, and James G Tabery. 2016. "Mechanisms in Science." In Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, edited by Edward N Zalta, Fall 2016.

Glennan, Stuart S. 1996. "Mechanisms and the Nature of Causation." Erkenntnis 44 (1): 49-71.

--. 2002. "Rethinking Mechanistic Explanation." Philosophy of Science 69 (S3): S342-53.

--. 2017. The New Mechanical Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Glennan, Stuart S, and Phyllis McKay Illari. 2017. The Routledge Handbook of Mechanisms and Mechanical Philosophy. The Routledge Handbook of Mechanisms and Mechanical Philosophy. London: Routledge.

Illari, Phyllis McKay, and Jon Williamson. 2012. "What Is a Mechanism? Thinking about Mechanisms across the Sciences." European Journal for Philosophy of Science 2 (1): 119-135.

Kaiser, Marie I, and Beate Krickel. 2017. "The Metaphysics of Constitutive Mechanistic Phenomena." British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 68 (3): 745-79.

Machamer, Peter, Lindley Darden, and Carl F Craver. 2000. "Thinking about Mechanisms." Philosophy of Science 67 (1): 1-25.

[1] Doubtless I find this point attractive because we came independently to a similar conclusion (cf. Glennan 2017, Chs 3-4).