The Mechanics of Divine Foreknowledge and Providence: A Time- Ordering Account

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T. Ryan Byerly, The Mechanics of Divine Foreknowledge and Providence: A Time- Ordering Account, Bloomsbury, 2014, 131pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623565596.

Reviewed by William Lane Craig, Talbot School of Theology/Houston Baptist University


In the current debate over divine foreknowledge of future contingents two questions predominate: (1) whether God's knowledge of future events is compatible with their contingency, and (2) how God can have knowledge of future contingent events.

As T. Ryan Byerly's title intimates, his purpose is to offer a new account of how God foreknows future contingents. His account thus addresses the second of the two questions. The book is divided into two parts. In the first Byerly attempts to situate his account within the framework of the ongoing debate over the first question. In the second he unfolds his own answer to the question of how God has literal foreknowledge of future contingent events.

Byerly thinks that all attempts heretofore to defeat what he calls the foreknowledge argument for theological fatalism are failures. But he agrees with certain critics of the argument that theological fatalism posits a constraint on future contingents that is unintelligible apart from causal determinism. Accordingly, Byerly argues that the foreknowledge argument is actually an argument for the causal determinacy of all events. Here is where he sees the relevance of question (2) to question (1). The proponent of the foreknowledge argument assumes that the only way in which God can have foreknowledge of future events is if those events are causally determinate with respect to the present.

Byerly thinks that the justification for that assumption is an inductive inference based upon human foreknowledge. The only foreknowledge of future events with which we are acquainted is based upon causal determinism, so God's foreknowledge of future events must be similarly based. This inductive premise can be defeated, Byerly advises, by offering a plausible theory of how God foreknows causally contingent events. Thus far Part I.

Unfortunately, this part of the book is, I think, of little interest or value. For the seasoned veteran of the foreknowledge debate Byerly's cursory review of the various solutions to the foreknowledge problem will not be illuminating. For the new student his tendentious summaries are apt to be misleading, as different positions are rejected almost as if by judicial verdict. Moreover, for so slim a volume (121 pages of text), this part of the book is surprisingly verbose and repetitive (see, e.g., the first and third paragraphs on p. 67). One cannot help but think that Byerly's contribution might better have been published as a philosophical article, rather than expanded into a book (at least a book of this sort, since elaboration of certain issues in Part II would have been welcome).

Furthermore, it seems to me that Byerly's attempt to frame his account of how God foreknows future contingents within the context of the debate over theological fatalism is misconceived and forced. The whole point of fatalism is that the causal determinacy/contingency of the future events foreknown or foretold is irrelevant. They could be utterly indeterminate causally, and yet in virtue of God's foreknowing them (or propositions' being true regarding them), they occur necessarily. Once the distinction between fatalism and determinism collapses, then theological fatalism is done for, and the discussion over question (1) above is over. Hence, it is misconceived to argue, as Byerly does, that the problem of theological fatalism provides an ostensible reason for believing in causal determinism. The debate over causal determinism is a distinct debate, and if theological fatalism requires causal determinism, then theological fatalism is nonsense.

Moreover, if the argument that divine foreknowledge requires causal determinism really is an inductive argument based on our familiarity with human knowledge of future events, then far from being the powerful argument that Byerly portrays it to be, such an inference is, it seems to me, terribly weak, being based upon an anthropomorphic conception of God which is obviously inappropriate. In view of the evident disanalogies between God and ourselves, we can repose no confidence in such an argument. As Byerly himself acknowledges, God could have ways of knowing things that are unlike anything that human beings enjoy. From my reading of the literature, I should say that the reason process thinkers and open theists deny God knowledge of future contingents is not based upon an inductive argument from human knowledge but upon a certain view of time and temporal becoming. But in that case Byerly's desired link between questions (1) and (2) is severed. Byerly's answer to question (2) is interesting enough in its own right and need not be framed as an answer to question (1).

In Part II Byerly presents what he calls "the time-ordering account" of divine foreknowledge. He provides the following concise summary of his theory:

God begins with the knowledge of every possible time. God then wills for some of these times to be ordered in a particular way so as to constitute the history of the actual world. By virtue of his self-awareness he knows that he wills this. His willing that the times should be ordered in such-and-such a way entails that the times are ordered in such-and-such a way, since he is omnipotent. And God knows that he is omnipotent, too, so he deduces that the times are ordered in such-and-such a way. Finally, the times being ordered in such-and-such a way entails everything which occurs in the history of the world, including everything which occurs at every future time. Since God knows this, too, he can competently deduce what will happen at every time, including the future times. (p. 76)

Byerly proceeds to unpack this theory and argues that it is consistent with the causal indeterminacy of events.

It becomes immediately evident in his unpacking of his theory that he is not talking about "times" as that word is normally understood. For Byerly a time is not concrete but is an abstract object, a certain kind of proposition, in fact: a maximal, temporally indifferent proposition. His view entails that times are true or false, contrary to the usual understanding, and that false times exist, times which lie neither in the past, present, nor future but were overlooked by God in his choice of a temporal ordering. This is a bizarre way of speaking, and Byerly's statement of his theory would have been much less misleading had he enunciated it, not in terms of times, but in terms of maximal, temporally indifferent propositions or states of affairs. Byerly himself notes that "times on the present account parallel popular accounts of possible worlds" such as are presented by Plantinga and others(p. 80). Once God orders the relevant states of affairs in terms of the earlier/later than relation, they become, in effect, temporal slices of a possible world, with the caveat that the world is a construction out of the slices.

One might suppose that God's ordering various states of affairs temporally is not sufficient for their actuality; after all, temporal slices of non-actual worlds are also temporally ordered. One might suppose that God must will to actualize or instantiate one such world or sequence of states in order to get a concrete world. But Byerly thinks that being temporally ordered is a sufficient condition for the actualization of a collection of temporally indifferent states. By ordering states according to earlier/later than relations, God actualizes a particular sequence of states. Other "times," other states, are left unordered. It is unclear how this coheres with the existence of non-actual worlds in which there is a temporal sequence of events, as well as with Byerly's claim that the temporally ordered states could have been ordered in a different temporal sequence, but let that pass.

The more important point is that Byerly's time-ordering account appears simply to replicate what Plantinga called Leibniz's Lapse and so solves nothing. Leibniz's Lapse was his assuming that God, in virtue of his omnipotence, can actualize any arbitrarily chosen possible world. Similarly, Byerly claims that God's "willing that the times should be ordered in such-and-such a way entails that the times are ordered in such-and-such a way, since he is omnipotent." (p. 76) The italicized "are" presumably indicates actuality, since God's temporally ordering abstract propositions or states of affairs is supposed to yield, not just a possible world, but the instantiation of the actual world. But there is no guarantee that God's chosen sequence of "times" will be actualized, for that depends partly on the free will of creatures, and they may not cooperate.

The theological determinist guarantees which temporal slice succeeds another by having God strongly actualize each slice; but Byerly rightly wants to resist causal determinism. The Molinist guarantees which slice succeeds another by having God utilize his middle knowledge to weakly actualize the chosen sequence of slices, though on this account not every possible sequence is feasible for God. Unfortunately, Byerly has denied himself the resources of Molinism. So he is left without any account of how God can guarantee that his selected ordering of times will be actualized. But then God will not know what the future in fact holds.

On Byerly's account, given human freedom, we should have to say that some "times" stubbornly resist being put into temporal order. More plausibly, I think, we should say that not every possible ordering of "times" is feasible for God. In either case Byerly fails to see that God's omnipotence does not serve to guarantee that his preferred ordering of states will be actual.

If this is right, then much of the wind goes out of the sails for the remainder of the book. For what good is time-ordering for divine providence (chapter 5) if it cannot provide a means of God's guaranteeing that a particular sequence of events will come to pass? In fact, it needs to be questioned whether Byerly's time-ordering account of divine concurrence (p. 100) does not imply occasionalism. Imagine that God were to reshuffle the temporal order of events so that things happen chaotically. In that case causal connections would not seem to exist between events in time, but only between God and the events. Similarly, in our world if the relations obtaining between events are due simply to God's time-ordering, then are they not merely the occasions upon which God chooses to causally produce some events?

Byerly's book closes with a brief chapter on the value and future of the time-ordering account. Here much more could have been said in defense of his view of "times" and about the implication of agents' freedom to will other than they do at any time t. But given its failure even to get off the ground, I am not optimistic about the future of the time-ordering account.