The Metaphysical Presuppositions of Being-in-the-World: A Confrontation between St. Thomas Aquinas and Martin Heidegger

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Caitlin Smith Gilson, The Metaphysical Presuppositions of Being-in-the-World: A Confrontation between St. Thomas Aquinas and Martin Heidegger, Continuum, 2010, 219pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441133465.

Reviewed by Timothy A. D. Hyde, Stony Brook University


This book is a meditation on how "the same is there for thinking and for being" or, alternatively, "how the soul is in a way all things." It juxtaposes a metaphysical onto-theo-logical approach to a phenomenological one and plumps unrepentantly for the former, although not without a certain, albeit limited, sense of intellectual sympathy for the latter. It analyzes these two approaches in terms of a four-fold structure that is "found in every genuine asking into the question of the meaning of Being" (xii): finitude, intentional presence, causality, and ananke stenai. It concludes that the ananke stenai envisioned by St. Thomas is the only way to prevent a pernicious infinite regress that would make knowledge and ethics impossible. This contrasts with phenomenology in general (Heidegger in particular) which leads us into "groundlessness" and "endlessness," (e.g., 103, 118) making it impossible for "thinking to catch up with Being," (e.g., 111) and thus "embraces a primordial Idealism," (100) losing "the primacy of existence over essence," (97) is "inauthentic," (100) and has "dangerous epistemological, moral, metaphysical and religious implications" (96).

The book begins with a discursus through Parmenides' poem, Plato's Parmenides, and Aristotle's De Anima. Gilson reads the poem as the introduction to how "the deity entered philosophy" (1). Finite man and his intentionality, on the one side, is introduced to being by the goddess of truth, on the other. Plato's Parmenides comes next and "is the manifestation of the dictum 'the same is for thinking as for Being' " (26), "anticipates … Husserlian epistemology" (18), and is the "critical dialogue for the delineation of the problematic of intentional presupposition" (18). Gilson reads the Parmenides as a reductio ad absurdum, showing the necessity of ananke stenai and the failure of phenomenological approaches. Finally, "Aristotle's De Anima goes a long way in epistemologically laying bare its [the attachment of man to the ultimate other as Other] necessary structure" (42).

It is not entirely clear what the purpose of these sections are. Although thoughtful and original, they are too tendentious to stand alone as interpretations of ancient thought, especially without some reference to the secondary literature. For the same reason they don't really justify the claim that the fourfold is at the heart of all true metaphysics. On the other hand, if they serve to clarify the concepts of the fourfold, this seems to be a case of explaining the less obscure by the more. For instance, the claim that we need to "understand this Otherness by means of difference as difference" (36-7) because that is the only way to simultaneously avoid skepticism and idealism is a plausible piece of Thomistic metaphysics. It is not made more so, however, by trying to extract it from Parmenides hypothesis v.

The second chapter analyzes St. Thomas' existential realism. It broadly follows and quotes Etienne Gilson's interpretation of St. Thomas.[1] "The soul is in a way all things because it can become a thing other than itself, because it can become the other as other without confiscating the other's otherness" (62 cf. CPTA 224). St. Thomas' realism has three elements to it. First, experience is a response to Being (62) and ultimately refers to a "fundamental other which/who regulates our knowledge" (61 cf. CPTA 226). Second, there is no question of how the soul gets outside of ourselves to know because, even as merely sentient, "the soul is already outside of itself," (73) as a fact -- St. Thomas' first principle is an existential-phenomenological one (73 cf. CPTA 233). And third, (Gilson quoting her namesake), "It is not the species of the object that is present in thought, but the object through its species" (72 = CPTA 228). "This intentional becoming of the soul does not, then, duplicate the real world" (66 cf. CPTA 229-31). Underlying and more primordial than truth as adequatio rei et intellectus is an accord in the being of the intellect and a thing, or to use Heideggerian phraseology, truth as correspondence presupposes truth as unhiddeness.

Aquinas, if Etienne Gilson's Aquinas is right, shares a non-humanist existentialist outlook with Heidegger. Or, as Caitlin Gilson has it, both see the need for finitude as an axis for ontology (95) -- although she falsely accuses Heidegger of presenting existentialism as a humanism (123). It is this shared outlook that is the prima facie reason that an Auseinandersetzung of the two in her third chapter should have proved fruitful. St. Thomas has a "positive" concept of finitude, one that is not an impediment to knowledge (95). Similarly, although Heidegger has a "negative" concept of finitude, his is unlike other negative concepts of finitude that are either skeptical or in which finitude is an impediment to knowledge. His is a "reversal" in the sense that Heidegger finds in it the basis of transcendence (96). The difference, as Gilson has it, and rightly so, is in the status of the infinity of the other, which she locates through the concepts of causality and ananke stenai, both essential to Aquinas's metaphysics and repudiated by Heidegger's phenomenology.

The third and fourth chapters situate Gilson's St. Thomas with respect to Heidegger. Chapter three is more critical of Heidegger; chapter four concentrates more on what St. Thomas has to offer us but ends up agreeing with much of Heidegger.

The basic problem with Gilson's analysis of Heidegger is that she misunderstands Heidegger's interpretation of the history of philosophy and his criticism of metaphysics. The result of this misunderstanding is that she doesn't choose the right points of comparison to adjudicate between St. Thomas and Heidegger. Gilson correctly understands Heidegger as describing how a metaphysical deity entered into philosophy and then left philosophy. Heidegger, in a sense, agrees with Gilson's analysis of modern philosophy. In particular, it replaced an uncaused cause with a self-caused cause that results in a godless idealism incapable of appreciating true alterity -- or from a Heideggerian's perspective results in what I like to call pragmatic nihilism, otherwise known as technicity.

But she then assumes that Heidegger, because he sees this necessary trajectory as part of the overcoming of metaphysics, is also a "pre-systematic" or "primordial" idealist, to use Gilson's expressions, whereas Heidegger is putting all of his resources to work against such a nihilism. He is horrified at our present predicament. In one place, he describes it as a "lack of distress at the utmost distress" (Beiträge §60); a nihilism that is comfortable with itself, if you like. Heidegger does think, however, that this destruction of metaphysics is a good thing for two reasons. First of all it prepares us to think being anew and second it allows us to think being anew in light of the history of (the destruction of) metaphysics (among other ways). Here again, there are similarities between Gilson and Heidegger. Gilson notes that what Heidegger finds problematic in Kant are traces of the uncaused cause (134); precisely what she finds admirable. Gilson's solution is to return to the greatest exemplar of a philosophy of the uncaused cause, St. Thomas. Heidegger too wants to find resources in the history of philosophy, but he wants to go back through the history of philosophy to its inception to make a leap to the another beginning (most notably in the Beiträge. One of its "fugues," "Das Zuspiel," is dedicated to exploring this idea.) But then the appropriate comparison is between a return to the 'un' of the uncaused cause verses a leap to another beginning of philosophy itself.

The discussion of the difference between an uncaused cause and a self-caused cause is insightful, an insight into the essence of modern philosophy that both Gilsons share.[2] In chapter three, Catlin Gilson argues that Descartes and henceforth modern philosophy's first principle is self-caused rather than St. Thomas' uncaused cause. This change brings god into the sphere of sufficient reason. God too needs to be caused. And Gilson plausibly argues that it is a short step from here to idealism and the death of any appreciation of god as truly other and hence true alterity at all. In chapter four, she agrees with much of what Heidegger says about the inappropriateness of thinking of being in terms of god and cause at all, but only because the modern concept of cause is bound up with god as self-caused. In the tradition of negative theology, the uncaused cause says nothing about god other than that the causal realm does not apply to god. The crucial element in thinking about god is in the 'un' of the uncaused cause.

But then the relevant comparison isn't between St. Thomas' uncaused cause and some godless relativistic nihilistic humanism, of which Gilson accuses Heidegger, but rather the comparison is between the 'un' in uncaused cause and the 'ab' in Heidegger's Abgrund. The real comparison is between being as needing a ground and being as neither having nor needing a ground. Gilson at one point defines causality as the insight that "everything must be referred to Being and … Being must be referred to God." (145) Heidegger stops the regress one step earlier. Being as abground is the locus of the uncaused. It doesn't need to be referred to god who then is the uncaused. In the conclusion to the last chapter (172ff.), in a surprising twist, Gilson admits that the "un" is indeed similar to Heidegger's groundlessness and uncanniness of being. She implicitly agrees with Heidegger's criticism that modern philosophy's desire that it should be presuppositionless is not only a presupposition but a self defeating one at that. (GA17:2 -- strictly speaking Heidegger talks of prejudice.) But then it must be said that Gilson seems to take back much of her criticisms of Heidegger.

Much the same can be said of the accusation that "Heidegger's goal is to rid ontology of its deity" (105), which seems to be taken to mean that Heidegger's ontology is purposefully atheistic and wants to deny us access to any other as other. While it is true that Heidegger argues that the role that god played with respect to being in the metaphysical tradition was inappropriate, that does not make his philosophy purposefully atheistic. Despite Heidegger's early pronouncement that philosophy is properly agnostic, in his later works, gods play an important role: the gods who need beying (§§191, 267) and the passing of the "Last God" (VII) in the Beiträge as well as the divinities of the fourfold (most notably in the Bremen lecture cycle of 1949 (GA79)), not to mention Heidegger's oracular pronouncement that only a god can save us (of Der Spiegel interview). The real Auseinandersetzungen between St. Thomas and Heidegger partially revolves around which of their approaches to divinity gets to a being centric understanding of the other, not whether one is atheistic or not. Heidegger says it best in his own words: "The god-less thinking which must abandon the god of philosophy, god as causa-sui, is thus perhaps closer to the divine God. Here this means only: god-less thinking is more open to Him than onto-theo-logic would like to admit." (GA11:64)[3]

A Heideggerian might well turn the tables on Gilson and say that Heidegger's "negative finitude" does not reflect a closet anthroprocentic idealism against which we should prefer a Thomistic "positive finitude" but rather a philosophy of earnestness, a radical realism that suggests that the groundlessness of being has ultimately positive implications and that the Thomistic yearning for infinitude is itself radically rooted in nihilism as Gilson seems to suggest when she asks: "Can Being tolerate or endure let alone enjoy Otherness without causality?" (110) The seeds of nihilism are already there and the result, the need for the counter-concept of ananke stenai, is really only a symptom of that nihilism. It is precisely this nihilism at the heart of metaphysics that needs to be overcome, not to deny the possibility of thinking the other as other, but rather to start to do so.

There is one peculiarity of the book. One of its central theses is that that all genuine ontological inquiries involve (i) finitude, (ii) intentional presence, (iii) causality and (iv) ananke stenai. However, this thesis is not only never argued for but its terms, neither self-evident nor canonical, do not even receive sustained analysis by themselves although they show up on almost every page. There is no attempt to justify the claim that these (and these alone?) are the matrix of any proper metaphysics -- surely an original and striking claim that needs some justification. We have to wait till page 127 for our first real discussion of ananke stenai and then a couple of pages later cause -- although the entire book hinges on whether we need an ananake stenai and on what sense cause has, as well as whether that sense is an appropriate one to talk about being.

Roughly, "finitude" refers to the existentialist side of St. Thomas. We are "in knowledge, unfinished and in Being, a complete unity" (104). Our experience is immanent and transcending (65). "Causality" refers to "the act of tracing the great chain of being until what is reached is something outside of and greater than the order of 'things'" (30). "Causality" points to a "kind of thereness in its genuine manifestation" (142). The notion of "intentional presence" is based on phenomenal fact rather than some epistemological doctrine (73) and "is the mode of being and the relational being-with and being-toward the world, the noetic bridge between man and world" (34). "ananke stenai" is Gilson's idiosyncratic term for what houses the "sheer irreducible and absolute Other" (62). The 'un' of the uncaused cause. The concepts of ananke stenai and causality mark the difference between St. Thomas and Heidegger. The real question is surely whether causality is an appropriate way to talk about being at all. Heidegger argues that cause is conceptually linked to presence-at-hand and thus skews any ontology. Sometimes, for Gilson, "causality" is just a place holder for the referring of entities to being and being to god, and perhaps that circumvents Heidegger criticism, but not always. When she finally first gets round to discussing "cause" (129) she uses the example of an acorn becoming tree. Why is that sort of causality appropriate to the meaning of being in general?

None of what I state here argues that Heidegger is right or that Gilson's St. Thomas wrong. It merely shows some of the needed points of comparison. Gilson may well have a case as far as the early Heidegger is concerned, from where most of her evidence is drawn. The first two divisions of Being and Time undoubtedly are, at least in part, an exercise in transcendental philosophy and are anthropocentric -- depending on the exact status of horizonality and historicality. Horizonality (see Sein und Zeit 143) is Heidegger's counter-concept to ananke stenai, but Gilson never considers it. She accurately lays out the difficulties of a philosophy that valorizes essence over existence, namely that man would be unable to be "a complete ontological unity that is at the same time moving." (102) But because Gilson doesn't discuss the way dasein can be a whole or not, Gilson hasn't even begun to make the case that Heidegger is guilty of any of this.

But the first parts of Being and Time, even then, were only to be propaedeutic to considering the question of the meaning of being in general. So even if Gilson had succeeded in showing that some of her criticisms are true of the early parts of the proposed project of Being and Time she would still need to address Heidegger's later thinking. And there are lots of places where one might fruitfully compare middle and later Heidegger with St. Thomas. The whole second half of chapter four -- a discussion of the interrogative nature of philosophy and temporality under the guises of the wait and aeviternality -- is a long series of missed opportunities to fruitfully engage Heidegger given the central role of questioning in Heidegger (both the Seinsfrage and the Seynsfrage, the second being of more importance to Gilson), his thoughts on temporality (both Zeitlichkeit and Temporalität since it is the latter, as the temporality of being in general, that would surely interest Gilson), and Heidegger's discussion of Der Sprung. I hope Gilson will consider taking some of these up at a later date.

[1] Etienne Gilson, The Christian Philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994), hereafter CPTA.

[2] See Etienne Gilson, Études Sur Le Rôle De La Pensée Médiévale Dans La Formation Du Système Cartésien (Paris: Librarie Philosophique J. Vrin, 1984), p.202ff.

[3] Martin Heidegger, Identity and Difference, trans. Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper & Row, 1974), p.72