The Metaphysics of Action: Trying, Doing, Causing

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David-Hillel Ruben, The Metaphysics of Action: Trying, Doing, Causing, Palgrave Macmillan, 2018, 351pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319903460.

Reviewed by Helen Steward, University of Leeds


What are actions? In this densely-argued and thought-provoking work, David-Hillel Ruben sets out to answer this question, by way of an examination of some of the ideas that have gained currency over the last 50 years or so of philosophy of action -- including what is usually called 'the standard story'; the view that actions are 'tryings'; and the view that they are 'causings'.This is a book for serious aficionados of philosophy of action. The arguments are detailed and hard-core, and not many attempts are made to broaden out the discussion so as, for example, to provide an insight into questions of free will or mental causation (though it must be said that there is an extremely fascinating final chapter which connects the discussion thus far to the sceptical problem of other minds). But for those aficionados, there is much of considerable interest here. Ruben argues, amongst other things, that there are no such things as tryings; that there are no such things as causings; that an action such as my (successful) melting of the chocolate should be identified with the event of the chocolate's melting, a view he calls 'one-particularism'; and that (therefore) agents at least sometimes cause their actions; and further, that many actions are located "out in the world, far removed from an agent's body" (p.10). In so doing, he takes on many popular views of action and indeed confronts accounts sufficiently widely held (or at any rate, sufficiently unquestioned) to have reached the status of philosophical orthodoxy.

I am not sure in the end whether, as a result of having read it, I believe any of the views for which Ruben argues that I did not already believe (of which there are quite a few). But it has to be said that Ruben is a very accomplished arguer -- he anticipates and forestalls natural objections, he persuasively deflects the charge of unnaturalness or unintuitiveness, wherever it rears its head; and he undermines opposing views with great vigour and determination. Moreover, where his own arguments are not quite conclusive, he is honest enough to admit it and to say so -- a tendency I applaud wholeheartedly, and which gives one a certain uneasy confidence that he might well be right about those he does judge compelling, and that adjustments to one's own views might be required as a result.

The first section of the book concerns tryings. Ruben's central claim in this section is that there are no trying particulars -- no tryings, as such. I have never been sure what I think about this issue -- I think I would be open to persuasion that Ruben is right. But I am doubtful about Ruben's strategy for showing that there are no tryings. One immediate problem is that he does little preparatory work to situate the idea of tryings in the literature, He just plunges in, seeking to argue, first, that tryings are not identical with physical actions (before going on to try to show that there cannot be 'naked' tryings, either -- where a trying would be naked "if and only if an agent tries to F but no token F-ing nor any token action of a type that the agent does because he believes that a token action of that type will lead to his F-ing occurs" (p.81)). But the concept of a trying is not an everyday concept. Though we regularly speak of trying to do things, no one except philosophers of action ever talks of tryings -- which is indeed something Ruben can (and I think does) reasonably count as defeasible evidence against them. What this means, however, is that there is no sensible way to get a handle on the notion of a trying event independently of the route by which philosophers came to believe that they needed to talk about tryings in the philosophy of action in the first place -- and so no sensible way to decide whether such things might, for example, be identical with physical actions, independently of the conception of tryings which is established by the philosophical arguments for their existence. I felt we really needed to be given those original arguments first -- so as to remind us why anyone ever thought to suggest there were such peculiar things as tryings to begin with.

What were those original arguments? To the best of my knowledge, it was reflection on certain sorts of abnormal case that made philosophers think that tryings needed to be admitted into our ontology. The case of Landry's patient, in particular, seems to have been influential in persuading both Brian O'Shaughnessy (1973) and Jennifer Hornsby (1980a) that we needed to recognise tryings. In William James' description of this case (which is indeed discussed by Ruben, but only after many pages of context-free interrogation of the question whether tryings might be physical actions), we are told that Landry's patient, who was lacking all proprioceptive sensation in his arm, was then blindfolded and asked to raise his arm on hearing a signal. Unbeknownst to him, though, when the signal sounded, his arm was forcibly held down by the doctor. James reports that the patient was surprised to find, when the blindfold was removed, that he had not raised his arm. But surely, the argument then proceeds, he must have tried to do so -- for isn't that what accounts for his erroneous belief that his arm was elevated? If it was true that he tried, though, one might think that, as O'Shaughnessy puts it,

there had to be that in the world, located at that time, which made his utterance 'I tried' true; and it was uniquely located at that time. Also, his trying had effects, like the travelling of message phenomena down his nerves . . . and it had causes . . . the decision or intention to try at the time of the signal. Thus, we have here that which is a real individual constituent of the world, unrepeatably located at a point in space and time, with both causes and effects. And this establishes it as an event. (pp.59-60)

Ruben does of course consider the case of Landry's patient and he agrees that Landry's patient tried to raise his arm. He is also prepared to concede that in such cases "it may be true that the agent fires some neurones, whether he knows or intends it or not" (p.46). What Ruben is not prepared to accept, however, is that the firing of these neurons, even if it occurred, might be regarded as identical with the agent's trying to raise his arm. He claims that there are no grounds for "taking the brain activity as intrinsic to any action the agent does" (p.46).

But I worry that for all that Ruben has shown, it might seem untrue that there are no such grounds. O'Shaughnessy's view, for instance, was that the agent's trying in the Landry case was an action, in and of itself -- it was itself something the agent did -- so it does not settle the question whether this brain activity was intrinsic to any action the agent does, to point out that no further events (e.g. muscle contractions or arm risings) are produced in the case of Landry's patient, which is the premise that Ruben mainly stresses. Moreover, one might invoke the very natural thought that what is true of us mentally must somehow depend on what is going on with us physically, and perhaps especially on what is going on in our brains, and that the dependencies might in certain cases allow for the making of token identifications between the mental and the physical events. Could we never come to have reasonable empirical grounds for identifying certain bits of neurological activities with our tryings? I myself think there are general philosophical arguments against the idea that we will ever be able to make such identifications (such arguments have for example been offered by Hornsby in her (1980b) and (1985)); but Ruben does not give them, and without them, one might wonder how this kind of line of thinking is to be blocked.

Moreover, if there is no trying event in the case of Landry's patient, what is Ruben's response to O'Shaughnessy's claim that "there had to be that in the world, located at that time, which made his utterance 'I tried' true"? For it is surely that thought which looks set to bring events of trying in its wake, at least in the case of 'naked' trying -- and perhaps potentially also in the case of all actions, given that Ruben is quite happy to accede to the thesis he calls 'TUT' (The Ubiquity of Trying) -- that whenever one acts, one is always trying to do something. I am not entirely sure what Ruben wants to say about this question.

One possibility is that he thinks O'Shaughnessy's claim is not true -- that there doesn't have to be anything located in the world at 't' which makes the utterance 'I tried' true at t. That this is how he would respond is suggested by what he has to say in Chapter 3 about different ways of handling the semantics of temporal qualification for 'naked trying', as he calls it -- trying which does not result in any action. But as he himself admits, none of the semantic options he surveys there is without its difficulties, which means one must fall back on a weighing of the relative advantages and disadvantages of acceding to tryings, on the one hand, and adopting potentially problematic semantic views, on the other. Another possibility is that he does think it is true, but that the temporally located thing doesn't have itself to be a trying -- that it might just be, e.g., a bit of neural activity, which, as it were, somehow grounds the fact that the agent tried at t without being identical with it. A third possibility, suggested by Ruben's positive account of trying, is that perhaps it is the truth of a subjunctive conditional at t which makes true the claim that Landry's patient tried at t -- namely, that he would have raised his arm at t if his arm hadn't been held down -- but one might worry that this way of doing things puts the cart before the horse. Surely if Landry would have raised his arm if his arm hadn't been held down, that must be because all the conditions for his raising his arm, including any conditions that depended upon his active intervention, were already satisfied? And how could those have been satisfied, exactly, in the absence of an event which simply was that active intervention -- an event which we (perhaps) might as well call a trying, in this case in which no actual physical action ensues? It is that thought which in my mind represents a lingering worry for the conditional theory of trying which is Ruben's favoured approach.

A second main thesis of Ruben's book is what he calls 'one-particularism'. Despite the fact that it is one of its main theses, there is unfortunately no very clear statement anywhere of what one-particularism is. Ruben first introduces the view (p.224) by reference to a view one can take about something he calls Causative Alternation '(CA)' -- it is said to be the view that the Left Hand Side (LHS) and the Right Hand Side (RHS) of (CA) "use two descriptions of a single particular". But this is confusing, because (CA) is not in fact a thesis at all. As defined by Ruben on p.170, (CA) is the name of an inference pattern -- namely, the pattern, valid for an important class of verbs, which Ruben calls 'ergative' verbs (where Vt indicates a transitive and Vi an intransitive verb):

(CA): FROM: a Vt b TO bVi (e.g. FROM 'Jane melted the chocolate' to 'The chocolate melted')

Nor does (CA), thus expressed, contain any descriptions of any particulars. It is a mere schema. Moreover, even if one attempts to be charitable and turns it into a thesis of some sort, thus:

(CA)* For ergative verbs, one can move validly from expressions of the form a Vt b to b Vi.

we still don't have any descriptions of anything, by means of which to decode the talk of 'two descriptions of a single particular'. I think the best interpretation of one-particularism is that it is the view, that, in the case of ergative verbs, definite descriptions such as 'a's Vt ing b' refer to the same event as 'b's Vi-ing'. It is the thesis that Jane's meltingt of the chocolate, for example, just was the chocolate's meltingi. In other words, one-particularism isn't really a general thesis about the metaphysics of action. It is a particular thesis about the referents of certain nominal phrases derived from specifically ergative verbs.

Ruben makes it seem, I think, as though one-particularism might be more than this -- that it might be a general metaphysical view of action - by suggesting that one-particularism wins by default in cases where the verbs in question are non-ergative. In the case of non-ergative verbs, he claims, "two-particularism doesn't even get off to a plausible start" (p.263). When someone is pushing a cart, for example, Ruben notes, there is no event, 'the being-pushed of the cart', which is caused by an agent's pushing of it. Ruben seems to think that in this case, what he calls 'two-particularism' is hopeless. But that depends what 'two-particularism' is. If it is just the view that we can always read off nominal expressions for two separate events, one of which is a causing of the other, from any sentence which says that an agent ø-ed (in a situation in which their ø-ing was an action), then of course it is false -- but it is a false semantic thesis. It is not clear that any metaphysical thesis about what pushings of carts really are is thereby in jeopardy. For example, they might still be causings. That agents who push carts cause certain things to happen -- e.g. cause their own bodies to move, cause wheels to turn, cause carts to move, etc. -- might still be perfectly true -- it's just that the way the verb 'push' works doesn't give us an easy way to read off the nature of any caused event, or events, from the active verb itself. This doesn't mean that so far as the metaphysics is concerned, actions aren't always causings, nor even that they aren't actions in virtue of being causings of a certain sort. It just means that we can't always say what they're causings of just by reading it off from the way the relevant active verb works.

Suppose, then, that one-particularism is simply a view about the relation between the referents of two groups of nominal expressions which can be formed from ergative verbs. Is it true? Thus interpreted, I find one-particularism deeply implausible. Why? Well, for the sorts of reasons one might find any basically semantic thesis to be wanting -- roughly, because it seems to me that 'the chocolate's meltingi' simply can't refer to anyone's action, even if the chocolate was, on the relevant occasion, melted by someone. And that is because meltingi is not something that anyone did -- it is something that the chocolate did -- so no individual thing's meltingi can be an action. Ruben argues that even though 'the chocolate's meltingi' is an expression which contains 'no agent-directed information' it doesn't follow that the event itself wasn't agent-directed. But I sense confusion here. What does 'agent-directed' mean? If information can be agent-directed, it is surely in a very different sense from the way in which events are agent-directed. Agent-directed information would seem to be information about the agent -- and it is certainly true that it doesn't follow from the fact that an expression which contains no information about the agent that the event itself wasn't an action (think of 'the most hideous action ever undertaken' or 'the sinkingt of the Belgrano'). It is also true that events like meltingsi can be 'agent-directed' if that means something like 'controlled (or initiated or organised) by an agent or agents'. But if 'agent-directed' is supposed to encode the relation which exists between an agent and her action, then a meltingi cannot be agent-directed, for a meltingi cannot have an agent -- that is what the subscript is doing here in the first place -- to remind us that the verb is being used in its intransitive sense. A meltingi can only have a patient. If an expression is to refer to an action, the expression does at least have to be suitable for referring to an action -- it has to be of the right grammatical sort -- which means that it has to be a ø-ing of a kind such that the agent (or agents) may be said to have ø-ed. But no agents melti -- at least, not ordinary agents, in our ordinary world. And even if they did, their meltingsi would not be their actions, but merely events that happened to them.

Ruben might reply that he wants to be doing metaphysics, not semantics. But if one-particularism is a metaphysical thesis, we need to be told more clearly what metaphysical thesis it is.


Hornsby, J. 1980a Actions. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Hornsby, J. 1980b 'Which Physical Events Are Mental Events?' Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 81: 73-92.

O'Shaughnessy, B. 1973. 'Trying (as the Mental Pineal Gland)'. Journal of Philosophy 70: 365-86.