The Metaphysics of Ceteris Paribus Laws

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Markus Schrenk, The Metaphysics of Ceteris Paribus Laws, Ontos, 2007, 192pp., $79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793428.

Reviewed by Max Kistler, Université Pierre Mendès-France, Grenoble/Institut Jean Nicod, Paris


Markus Schrenk's The Metaphysics of Ceteris Paribus Laws, based on his Oxford doctoral thesis, is a very rich and original contribution to a vivid debate in present day philosophy of science and metaphysics. The question is whether laws of nature can have exceptions. There seems to be an urgent need for a concept of laws that allow for exceptions, particularly so as to understand so-called special sciences like biology or psychology. Certain dysfunctional haemoglobin molecules, such as haemoglobin M, do not form bonds with oxygen, although it is a law of biochemistry that haemoglobin does form such bonds (see p. 136). The challenge is to understand how a universal generalisation can express a law and nevertheless be compatible with exceptions. This seems paradoxical: it is generally considered to be necessary for a statement to express a law of nature that it be strictly universal and true. Following, with Schrenk, the tradition of representing law statements by the excessively simple formula (L) "x (Fx Gx), standing for "all F are G", such as "all haemoglobin molecules form bonds with oxygen molecules", the paradox of exceptions is this: an exception would seem to have to be an object that is F but not G. But if such an object exists, it refutes the law statement (L). Now, if the law statement is false, then there is no law to the effect that all F are G. However, without a law, there can be no exception to the law. Either the law is true, in which case there are no exceptions, i.e. refuting instances, or the law statement is false, in which case there are instances refuting the law hypothesis, thus the hypothesis is false and there is no law to which those instances could be exceptions.

There is an important literature on this topic, and several strategies have been devised to resolve the paradox. At first, the major motivation came from the attempt to understand the scientific status of special sciences such as psychology. Philosophers such as Fodor, Pietroski and Rey have tried to develop a theory of laws that allows psychology to discover laws, and in this way to satisfy a requirement for being a genuine science, although it is a fact about psychological regularities that there are exceptional circumstances where the antecedent is not followed by the consequent. Recently, the need to resolve the paradox of exceptions to laws has become even more pressing, because some philosophers, such as Nancy Cartwright, have claimed that there are also exceptions to the laws of fundamental science, even to the laws of physics.

So far, I have deliberately avoided using the phrase "ceteris paribus". Schrenk's book addresses an issue quite distinct from, though related to, the topic of the mainstream literature on exceptions. According to one major proposal, laws can have exceptions because they are not descriptive statements intended to be literally true of regularities, but tools that can be used to produce explanations and predictions. Galileo's law of free fall says that near the surface of the earth, the distance a body has fallen after t seconds of free fall is gt²/2. In common circumstances, i.e. if you let an object fall in the air and not in a vacuum tube, it will in fact fall a shorter distance. In order to predict the real falling distance, you may use Galileo's law as one tool among others, and combine it with other laws, in particular with a law about the force produced by the friction of a body of a given form falling with a certain speed in air of a certain density. According to another approach, law statements are descriptive and intended to be literally true, but of ideal, not real, regularities. These statements about ideal regularities are nevertheless supposed to be used, through a procedure of progressive "de-idealisation", to predict and explain real phenomena. Galileo's law is true of "ideal" falls, which result from gravitational interaction in the absence of any other force or interaction, and which are moreover only of infinitesimal length. (The latter proviso is necessary because the acceleration factor, g, is not really constant during a fall, but increases with the proximity to the centre of attraction, i.e. the centre of the Earth.) Still another proposal has it that law statements express dependence relationships not between actual properties, but between dispositional properties. The body really has the disposition to fall gt²/2 meters in t seconds, although this disposition does not, in ordinary circumstances, manifest itself in a straightforward manner, because the manifestation is the result of a superposition of many dispositions. According to most of these approaches, the puzzle of exceptions is solved by giving law statements a logical form different from universally quantified true statements bearing on actual phenomena. If there are exceptions to the law hypothesis that all F are G, the law is expressed by the hedged statement "ceteris paribus, all F are G". "Ceteris paribus" literally means "all else being equal". However, in the way it is actually used, its meaning is better expressed by the conditional clause "if nothing interferes".

Markus Schrenk makes it very clear from the beginning that his book is not about exceptions of this kind, and that he does not intend to contribute to the debate on the comparative merits and difficulties of extant proposals to analyse the logic and semantics of ceteris paribus law statements. After a short introduction to the topic of ceteris paribus laws and different ways of avoiding the paradoxical implications they seem to have, Schrenk introduces the real topic of his book: his project is to find out whether laws can have real exceptions. He claims that most of the literature on ceteris paribus clauses is about "pseudo exceptions", i.e. situations in which a law cannot be applied in a straightforward way to make predictions about real phenomena. A situation in which a body falls a shorter distance in a given time than a simple application of Galileo's law would predict is no real exception to Galileo's law, and scientists are right in not taking such a situation as refuting the law. This extremely common situation should simply make us realize that predicting a phenomenon, such as the distance a real object falls in real circumstances, requires several steps of reasoning: first one calculates the forces resulting from different interactions of the body with its environment, then one calculates the net force resulting from the simultaneous action of these different forces and finally, one calculates the acceleration, speed, and falling distance produced by that net force. A pseudo exception looks like an exception only insofar as one oversimplifies the process leading from law to prediction.

Schrenk's book is mostly (I'll come back to this qualification later) about real exceptions, pseudo exceptions being mentioned in the first chapter to put them aside, and to clear the way for the analysis of real exceptions. A real exception to the law that all F are G is a situation in which nothing interferes, and in which no other forces or influences are present that might prevent the consequent G from being exemplified, but in which nevertheless there is an F that is not G. The question Schrenk asks is very different from those raised in the literature on ceteris paribus laws: are laws conceivable that do not correspond to, or do not give rise to, strict universal regularities, even if nothing interferes? Real exceptions resemble miracles (miracles are discussed in chapter 2.1.8 of the book), i.e. situations in which some natural regularity is broken, or violated, but not by the intervention of any natural force that is itself perfectly regular and lawful. Real exceptions differ from miracles in that they are secular: real exceptions are not due to the intervention of natural or divine forces. Real exceptions do not have anything to do with whether "other things are equal" and in that sense, the title of the book may be misleading.

Part I of the book introduces the distinction between real and pseudo exceptions and the distinction between fundamental and non-fundamental laws. Fundamental laws are about dependence relations between properties of elementary particles. Non-fundamental laws bear on properties of complex objects whose properties supervene on properties of their parts, such that non-fundamental laws are more or less dependent on the (more fundamental) laws applying to the properties of those parts. In Part II, Schrenk asks whether it is conceivable that there are real exceptions to fundamental laws; Part III raises the analogue question for non-fundamental laws.

With respect to fundamental laws, Schrenk suggests two candidates for laws with exceptions: index-laws and singularities. An "index-regularity" is a regularity that is universal except for a finite number of space-time regions. (To count as a law, it must satisfy further requirements, to be analysed later.) Take the regularity that "all F are G". If an object o that is F is at an index, i.e. a space-time point that is exceptional with respect to this regularity, it may not be G. Schrenk (p. 52) distinguishes three possibilities of what may happen to Fs at indices: either there is no regularity at all concerning the properties of Fs, in which case the index is chaotic, or they may be subject to some other regularity characteristic of all indices, such that, e.g. at all indices, Fs are H instead of G, or Fs may have no other property whatsoever at indices.

Indices seem rather artificial and far fetched until Schrenk adds his second candidate for real exceptions: black holes. Quoting distinguished physicist Hawking and philosophical expert on physics Earman, Schrenk tells us that black holes are singularities whose existence is predicted by the general theory of relativity. A singularity is a "point of infinite density and infinite curvature of space time. All the known laws of science would break down at such a point" (quote from Hawking at p. 54, emphasis Schrenk's). Apart from black holes that swallow all matter in their vicinities, and in which there is no time, physicists have shown that general relativity also allows the existence of "white holes" that "spit out matter at random" (p. 55). Up to the point where he introduces black holes, the whole issue of the conceivability of real exceptions might appear as idle speculation. However, the fact that our best physics predicts the existence of space-time points at which all laws have exceptions shows that Schrenk's project has real importance for philosophy of science and metaphysics.

The remainder of Part II is dedicated to the question whether David Lewis' and David Armstrong's conceptions of laws are compatible with laws that have real exceptions. The idea is that not every universal statement that is not true at a finite set of indices expresses a law. Schrenk therefore tries to add Lewisian or Armstrongian sufficient conditions for lawhood and asks whether regularities with indices are compatible with these criteria. The answer is that Lewis' "best-system" analysis of laws allows for laws with real exceptions: it suffices that their statements are part of the theory that achieves the overall best combination of strength and simplicity. The result is less clear-cut in Armstrong's framework. The only way in which a law N(F, G) might have real exceptions in Armstrong's theory is that the nomological relation N between universals F and G might not exist at some time and place. But then there is no law at those points, which is different from a law with exceptions.

In Part III, Schrenk enquires into whether there may be exceptions to non-fundamental laws. Such laws concern properties of complex objects, such as animals and people. He distinguishes between "grounded laws" and "emergent laws". The former depend on the laws applying to the parts of those complex objects in virtue of the properties of those parts and the structural relations between them. Emergent laws are laws bearing on complex objects that do not necessarily depend on the underlying structures of those objects. Schrenk concludes that a grounded law can have exceptions in two ways: because there is an exception to one of the underlying laws on which it is grounded, or because the underlying structure is abnormal, so that the antecedent still applies but not the consequent. Emergent laws can have exceptions within the framework of Lewis' best-system analysis, for exactly the same reason as fundamental laws. If non-fundamental laws are not logically reducible to fundamental laws, they can still be laws on condition of winning the competition for the best system: Schrenk's idea is that one has to run a separate best-system competition for each non-fundamental and irreducible science.

Schrenk's book is very clearly written and carefully argued. It contains many illuminating insights that will greatly contribute to clarifying the debate on exceptions and ceteris paribus clauses. Schrenk's distinction between pseudo and real exceptions helps avoid confusions between the topics of interferences, idealizations and approximations on the one hand and real exceptions on the other. Another very useful contribution is Schrenk's analysis of two sources of confusion, which he calls the "epistemic trap" and the "probabilistic trap" (first introduced on p. 44). One falls in the epistemic trap when one confuses an exception to the imperfect linguistic statement of a law with an exception to the law itself. One falls into the probabilistic trap if one mistakes what is really a probabilistic law for a law with exceptions.

Let me end with some critical remarks: First, the form of index-laws is ""u (Fu ∧ ¬ @ (x, y z, t)u Gu)". In words, all F that are not at the exceptional space-time point (index) @(x,y,z,t) are G. The fact that the negation of the index appears explicitly in their antecedent turns such laws formally into strict laws. Schrenk address this problem several times (e.g. on p. 82): his idea is that the law does not exactly correspond to the content of the index-law statement. Only "a language centred approach might judge that the law is strict after all" (p. 83). However, Schrenk does not make it perfectly clear how this problem can be avoided by switching to a "metaphysics focussed perspective which makes the exception visible" (ibid.). An additional problem with index-laws is that they do not seem apt to be used in counterfactual reasoning: all indices in the actual world are explicitly mentioned in the antecedent, but at other possible worlds the same law has presumably other indices.

Second, the distinction between grounded and emergent laws seems ill-founded as a metaphysical distinction. The difference between laws that are grounded and laws that we consider on their own, whether or not they are grounded, is an epistemic difference in our way of considering them. In themselves, all non-fundamental laws are grounded. As the literature on reduction shows, probably none are grounded in the way Schrenk conceives of grounding: by way of logical deduction along the lines of Nagel's model in The Structure of Science.

Third, the relation between indices and physically real singularities such as black holes is not sufficiently clear. Schrenk treats them as two different types of real exceptions. However, indices seem rather to be the formal equivalent to physical black holes: an index is just a space-time point at which there is a physical singularity.

Fourth, it is confusing that Schrenk turns toward the end of the book (pp. 158-169) to the issue of ceteris paribus laws, in the sense he had explicitly announced not to tackle in his book. The reader wonders why Schrenk is interested in rescuing Pietroski and Rey's account of exceptions from an objection raised by Earman and Roberts, because it is clear that Pietroski and Rey exclusively intend to analyse what Schrenk calls pseudo exceptions and not real exceptions. Schrenk is conscious (see footnote 9 on p. 169) of the risk of confusing the reader by discussing pseudo exceptions with the analytic tools he has developed for real exceptions. The "cosmetic operation" recommended on p. 166, to "delete all the exclusion phrases of exceptional individuals from the laws' antecedents and attach instead the proviso clause 'ceteris paribus'", results in blurring the distinction between pseudo and real exceptions, which is puzzling in a book in which that distinction is central.

Last but not least I must mention a regrettable negligence in the edition of the logical formulas. Most logical symbols in most formulas have been replaced by "" or "D", which makes those formulas rather useless, although the reader can most of the time guess what symbols the author had in mind. Sometimes however, e.g. in the complex definition of grounded laws on pp. 132-133, it is not so easy to guess which formula was intended. I guess "²" on p. 87 should be "≠". Strangely, one formula, on p. 53, is correct. [These errors occur in the first  printing but have been corrrected in subsequent printings.]

Schrenk's book is a pleasure to read. He never succumbs to the temptation of vagueness or fuzziness to hide difficulties. The problems raised by real exceptions are stated with exemplary clarity; the fact that the solutions he offers can be criticised is a virtue rather than a vice. The Metaphysics of Ceteris Paribus Laws greatly advances the debate on this topic. It will be essential reading for all students and scholars interested in exceptions. Its clarity, concision and rigorous argumentation also makes it suitable for graduate classes in philosophy of science and metaphysics.