The Metaphysics of Gender

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Charlotte Witt, The Metaphysics of Gender, Oxford University Press, 2011, 153pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199740406.

Reviewed by Ásta Kristjana Sveinsdóttir, San Francisco State University


Charlotte Witt has published a bold new book on the metaphysics of our social world, in which she argues for gender essentialism. This may appear a surprising project, given that as a result of decades of feminist critiques "essentialism" has become a dirty word in feminist circles. However, as we read on we realize that she is not arguing for the vilified form of essentialism, kind essentialism, i.e., the view that to be a man (or woman) one need have some particular property that constitutes the essence of the kind and which explains and justifies the behavior of its members. Instead, she is offering a metaphysics of the social space we live in: what unifies and organizes the various social roles we occupy (parent, academic, politician, friend, student, etc.). Witt argues that gender is the function that unifies and organizes all our other social roles and is thus uniessential to us social individuals.

Witt's gender essentialism is thus a view about the structure of social normativity, where social normativity is distinguished from other forms of normativity (including moral) and consists in the expectations, obligations, and allowances that the various social roles we occupy bring us. Witt thinks we are responsive to, and evaluated with respect to, these norms irrespective of whether we endorse them consciously or unconsciously (unlike what many would say about moral norms). She notes they often pull in different directions: my role as daughter may demand I kill the slayer of my father, my role as sister that I protect my brother at all costs. What unifies my many roles, however, is my gender. It also conditions my practical agency in the sense that gender expectations and obligations trump other ones, often making it impossible to fulfill the obligations of the various social roles adequately. The gendering of our social roles is largely to blame.

Now you may ask: haven't feminists been calling attention to and fighting such gendering at least since the seventies? Yes, but here we have a theoretical account of why the gendering is so pervasive, complete with an ontological picture of the relationship among human organisms, persons, and social individuals, and the mechanisms operating in the social world. A deeper understanding of the metaphysics of our social world and the mechanics of its gendering is a key component in our fight against sexist oppression.

The central claim in her account of the pervasiveness of the gendering of our social norms is that, as a matter of fact, in western late-capitalist societies like the U.S., gender is uniessential to social individuals. Let us flesh this out.

First, for a function to be uniessential to an entity is for it to unify and organize all the parts of that individual into the whole that is the individual. For example, the time-telling function unifies and organizes all the tiny metal parts (hands, spring, gears, etc.) into the whole which is the watch itself. Similarly, the sheltering function unifies and organizes all the planks of a wooden house into the entity that is the house itself.

Gender, understood in this way, is a function that organizes all the parts of a social individual into the social individual it is. The parts in question are all the other social roles the social individual occupies: parent, friend, professor, child, colleague, etc. Gender (man, woman) is a mega-social role that unifies all the other social roles into the agent that is the social individual. Being a woman, a parent, etc., is to occupy a social position, with which come norms of behavior. The social individual is the entity that occupies all these social positions, the bearer of these social properties, if you will.

The social individual is distinct from the human organism and the person because the social individual stands in social relations essentially, but human organisms and persons do so only accidentally. Similarly, the person is distinct from the human organism and the social individual because the person has the capacity to take a first-person perspective on itself essentially, but the human organism and the social individual only have that accidentally. Finally, the human organism has certain biological features essentially, but the person and the social individual does so only accidentally.

What determines whether you occupy a certain social position? On Witt's view, being a man and being a woman are social positions -- social statuses, if you will -- that come with social norms, and people are responsive to and evaluated with respect to these norms irrespective of their self-understanding or their endorsing these norms. Whether they occupy these positions or not depends on their being socially recognized. The social recognition includes recognition of other members of the group, institutional recognition as exemplified by a birth certificate, driver's licenses, marriage licenses, and other forms of group recognition such as initiation rituals.

The argument for the main claim is as follows:

  1. The social individual is a separate entity from the person and the human organism.
  2. We need an account of the normative unity of social individuals.
  3. The normative unity of social individuals consists in a role or norm that trumps other norms and that unifies and organizes other roles.
  4. Why do we need social individuals to be normatively unified? Because they are agents. We need an account of what unifies their agency.
  5. The normative unity of the person cannot do the trick because it consists of moral norms.
  6. The normative unity of the human cannot do the trick it consists of biological norms.
  7. There are various alternatives: a) race, or a similar category; b) a variable based on self-understanding; c) the engendering function.
  8. The normative unity of social individuals isn't race, or a similar category.
  9. The normative unity of social individuals isn't a variable based on self-understanding because social individuals need normative unity even when lacking self-understanding.
  10. Gender provides the principle of normative unity: this is because gender is a consequence of a relationship to a necessary social function, namely, reproduction.

I think that Witt offers a very rich and original account of why the gendering of our social roles is so pervasive and, consequently, of what a good part of our fight against sexist oppression should be directed at. I'm very sympathetic with the aim of the project. But I worry that taking on the metaphysical picture she offers is too large a price to pay for giving a systematic account of the pervasiveness of the gendering. My criticisms focus on three broad issues. One is the grounding of gender in reproduction. Another is the nature of social normativity and its role in practical agency. And the third is the ontology underlying Witt's view.

Let me start with the ontological picture. Witt's view is broadly Aristotelian, and she allows that there can be more than one entity in the same spatiotemporal location. Witt wants there to be social individuals, as well as human beings and persons. I'm not convinced that we need all three and I worry about the proliferation of entities.

Consider Anna, Witt's daughter. On Witt's view, in the spatiotemporal location where we look for Anna, we will find three entities. Apart from the human being and the person, we also have the social individual. It isn't that I'm against there being many different objects of different kinds in the spatiotemporal region. I'm quite happy with having Anna as well as Anna's body cohabiting, just as I am happy to have Venus de Milo and the hunk of marble it is made of happily cohabiting in the Louvre. My worry is that the entities Witt wants to cohabit seem to me not to be clearly different kinds. In particular they all seem agents to me.

Consider the following analogy: being a student has different essential features than being a human being has. Anna is a human being, a person, and a social individual. Anna is also a student. Why not say that Anna the student will cease to be when she ceases to go to school but that now she is happily cohabiting with Anna the human, Anna the person, and Anna the social individual? Aren't being a person and being a social individual more like being a student, properties that human beings can acquire?

The argument for all these three being distinct is that they are not coextensive and that they differ in modal properties. And that is all well and good. But so is being a student and being a human being. Not all humans are students, and if you count dogs in the circus school in San Francisco, not all students are humans. The question just is who is the agent in all this? Do we have three or do we have only one, the human organism, who is also a person, and a social individual?

Perhaps the argument for their being distinct rests not on failure of coextension and distinct modal properties but on their being subject to three distinct norms (biological, moral, and social). If so, then the introduction of the fact that Anna is a student will not generate any extra entities, since students are perhaps simply subject to social norms. But while that may work for being a student, some other roles seem to introduce other norms. What are we to do about Anna's doing her logic assignment? Doesn't that introduce some more norms, logical norms? And what is the entity that is subject to it? Do we have to add one more entity to the human, the person, and the social individual, namely, the logical thinker?

The above is not an argument for these phenomena not being conceptually distinct. They are. But why not say that humans are sometimes persons (when they take a first-person perspective on themselves) and that they are sometimes (even always) social individuals, that is, take up positions on a social map with which come constraints and enablements? On that kind of view, there is only one kind of agent in there. There is just Anna. But for most of her life, she is a person, and for all of her life, she is a social individual.

The second point of criticism concerns the claim that gender unifies all our other social roles. The central argument was premised on the fact that social individuals need a principle of normative unity, they need something that unifies their parts into the whole that is the social individual. It shouldn't be just any old function, but a characteristic function. But how is the analogy with the house and the planks that make it up supposed to work?

House: the sheltering function unifies and organizes the planks into a house.

Social individual: the gendering function unifies and organizes the various social roles into a social individual.

What seems disanalogous to me is that the sheltering function defines what a house is, whereas it doesn't seem that the engendering function defines what a social individual is, however pervasive the gender inflection on our other social roles is. This is also a case where one social role is supposed to unify and organize all the others, as opposed to a function unifying and organizing material parts into the whole that is the house. However, Witt mentions another analogy that might work better; this is the analogy with the academic. Consider:

Academic: the characteristic function for university professors is to do their part in a system of higher learning. This characteristic function unifies and organizes all the other roles academics find themselves in: scholar, teacher, advisor, administrator, colleague, and so on.

Social individual: the characteristic function, i.e., the engendering function, unifies and organizes all the other social roles that social individuals have in the social world.

But the disanalogy persists. It seems to me that a social individual's characteristic function is to play its part in a system of social relations, which involves being responded to, and evaluated with respect to, norms that accompany any specific location on the social map. Gender is just one social role among many that is in need of unification and organization by that (albeit quite abstract-sounding) characteristic function.

I take it that Witt thinks the engendering function is a characteristic function of social individuals because of its relationship to reproduction. Let us look at the central analogy: engendering is to reproduction as dining is to feeding.

The main idea is, and it is in many ways an attractive one, that there are basic functions that humans need to perform but that need, and the underlying material conditions, radically underdetermine the form that the performance of that function can take. I take it that the engendering function and the dining function are at the social level, and reproduction and feeding are at the biological level. The analogy goes like this: We have the need to eat. That need and the material conditions we find ourselves in radically underdetermine the way that need gets satisfied. Dining practices are social conventions set up to respond to the biological need we have to eat. Similarly, we have a need to reproduce but that need and the material conditions we find ourselves in radically underdetermine the way that need gets met. The system of gender relations are social conventions set up to respond to our biological need for reproduction.

There are some disanalogies here. The organism can be said to have a need to feed itself or be fed, but it doesn't seem that the organism has a similar need to reproduce. If it did, then the people who do not reproduce would not be meeting some basic need, and that seems implausible. We might want to say that the population has a need to reproduce itself, where "population" is defined purely in biological terms, and where we then say that various social reproductive practices are ways of responding to that need. But if we say that, then it seems that the two genders Witt thinks are needed at the social level to respond to the biological need are not enough. For there are many other roles played by individuals that serve a reproductive function for the population, and on which the health of the population depends, including priests, caregivers of various sorts, teachers, and so on.

Even if we want to restrict gender roles to roles in the reproduction economy, so that individuals who do not partake in it by providing the biological material don't get assigned a gender, we run into another problem. Witt's view is that gender unifies and organizes all our other social roles; it would follow that the agency of priests and others who would lack gender would lack normative unity.

So while I agree with Witt that being of a gender is a social position, conferred onto us (as I would put it), I don't think that what is being tracked in the conferral is solely a perceived role in the system of biological reproduction. I think that is sometimes what is being tracked, but often it is not. Frequently what is tracked in the conferral of the status of being a woman, man, or some other gender is mere presence of some body parts, presumed sexual orientation, self-presentation and the like. So I think Witt's account of gender is too narrow.

But the other point of disagreement is the role of gender in underwriting our practical social agency. I think there is something else that has to do it. But I don't think we need some principle of normative unity. I think all we need is intentionality and practical rationality. We need to be able to form attitudes about things, be it food we want to eat or a film we want to see. And we need to have the capacity for practical rationality, namely, to take the means towards our ends. Human organisms are capable of this, as are other animals, such as dogs. And both humans and dogs are social beings.

Any metaphysical account worth its salt is going to have something others will disagree with. I have focused on these three points of disagreement. But there is much that I do agree with in Witt's account and I have learned with from it. Her book is a sustained argument for a precise thesis that weaves together issues in feminist theory, metaphysics, moral psychology, ethics, and political philosophy. There are not many works that achieve this. Witt's book is a very important contribution to our understanding of the metaphysics of social reality and of sexist oppression. Much attention has been given of late to the role of implicit biases, unconscious behavior, and gender schemas in perpetuating oppressive social structures. That is all to the good, but the problem of sexist oppression doesn't take the form of explicit discriminatory laws or lie within our individual psyches. A large part of the problem lies in the gendered nature of the social norms that are neither chosen nor endorsed by us, but that we nevertheless live by.