The Metaphysics of Hyperspace

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Hud Hudson, The Metaphysics of Hyperspace, Oxford University Press, 2005, 223pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199282579.

Reviewed by Cody Gilmore, University of California at Davis


The Metaphysics of Hyperspace is "a collection of largely independent essays on some of the outstanding issues in the metaphysics of material objects" (p. 16). It is an impressive and extremely enjoyable book. It is packed with original proposals, imaginative, often bizarre scenarios, and carefully worked out new arguments. Hudson is a master at making sophisticated work in metaphysics accessible and engaging without sacrificing rigor, and this ability is on display throughout.

Of its eight chapters, three are devoted to Hudson's hyperspace hypothesis, according to which our world has more than three spatial dimensions. Chapter 1 discusses some nontheistic considerations in favor of hyperspace, Chapter 7 presents some theistic considerations, and Chapter 8 some specifically Christian ones. The intervening chapters deal with issues about contact, boundaries, parthood, superluminal motion, causation, mirror images and, especially, the occupancy relations that things bear to regions of space or spacetime.

The topics discussed in the book range even more widely than this list would suggest. One section, which was originally published in the American Mathematical Monthly and made the topic of an article in Scientific American, presents an ingenious apparent counterexample to the famous four-color theorem in topology.[1] (Regrettably, the illustrations are not in color.) Another section argues for the existence of a fourth spatial dimension by noting that it would explain how the Virgin Mary could have been impregnated without having been penetrated in any of the usual senses and without anything having jumped discontinuously from her exterior to her interior. (For better or worse, this section contains no illustrations.)

Although this review will focus on Hudson's case for hyperspace, I will begin with a brief description of the remainder.

Chapter 2. A thing exactly occupies a region of space just in case, roughly, the thing has the same shape and size as the region and stands in all the same spatial relations to other entities as does the region. Hudson's main goal in this chapter is to argue that there are no geometrical or topological constraints on the sorts of regions that material objects can exactly occupy. He does this indirectly, by attacking what he regards as the three most natural such constraints: (i) the C-theory, according to which a material object can exactly occupy only a closed region, one that has an 'outermost skin of points,' (ii) the O-theory, according to which a material object can exactly occupy only an open region, one that lacks such a skin, and (iii) the T-theory, according to which a material object can exactly occupy only a three-dimensional region.

Chapter 3. After skillfully Chisholming his way to a distinctive and appealing definition of perfect contact, Hudson defends a conception of boundaries (e.g., the 2D surface of a sphere) as independent concrete particulars. Hudson's view contrasts with a traditional theory according to which boundaries are in some sense dependent particulars that are essentially boundaries of things distinct from themselves.

Chapter 4. A spatially extended material simple is a material object that lacks proper parts but exactly occupies a spatial region containing more than one point. Are such objects possible? Against a number of recent philosophers, Hudson thinks not and lays out some problems (three already existing, one new) for extended simples. His primary aim in the chapter, though, is to chart the ways in which the force of each problem varies depending upon how the given simple fills up an extended region. (By exactly occupying just one region? By exactly occupying each subregion of the union of the regions that it exactly occupies? By exactly occupying each of many regions but not their union?)

Chapter 5. If one shines a laser pointer at the moon and moves the beam back and forth rapidly, the small, red spot that it projects will move across the moon's surface at greater than light speed. Suppose that the moon is a perfect sphere with a literally 2D surface. Now consider the spacetime path that this surface sweeps out over its career, and suppose, as Hudson does, that for any subregion R of this path, there is a part of the moon's surface that is itself a material object and that has R as its complete spacetime path. Then there will be a small, roundish, spatially two-dimensional material object that 'goes exactly where our red spot goes', so to speak. It would seem, therefore, that this object, like the red spot it travels with, moves at greater than light speed. So, special relativity's allegedly contrary implications notwithstanding, some material objects travel faster than light. Hudson advocates basically this line of thought, replies to some powerful criticisms it has generated, and explores the bearing of his hyperspace hypothesis on the possibility of superluminal motion.

Chapter 6. Are there such entities as mirror images, and if so, what is their nature? Hudson defends a reductive realism about them: mirror images exist but are material objects -- specifically, they are spatiotemporal parts of the surfaces of the mirrors (or what have you) onto which they are cast. He then formulates a special form of determinism that plausibly holds for mirror images (their behavior is fixed in a certain way by certain other things). Finally he raises the question: given the relevant determinism, could mirror images nevertheless act freely? Hudson argues that the prospects for this sort of compatibilism are significantly worse than those for compatibilism about human free will and causal determinism.


Imagine a 3D Euclidian space that has been exhaustively partitioned into a continuum of parallel, non-intersecting, 2D planes -- 'Flatlands'. Suppose that some of these planes are inhabited by sentient, two-dimensional Flatlanders, who can move around freely within their home planes but cannot move from one plane to another. All other causal processes are similarly barred from crossing planes, and the laws of nature vary from plane to plane. Thus a given Flatlander has access only to the contents of his own plane and is causally isolated from other planes and their inhabitants. There is, however, always some determinate spatial distance between him and any other entity in the encompassing 3-space, and he can be arbitrarily spatially near to inhabitants of other planes.

Similarly, according to Hudson's hyperspace hypothesis, our 3-space (or 4D-spacetime) is just one 'slice' in a literal continuum of (largely) physically independent, (mostly) causally isolated 3-spaces that together form a 4-space (or 5D spacetime). Despite our causal isolation from things in other 3-spaces, we always stand in determinate spatial or spatiotemporal relations to those things, and they can be arbitrarily near to us.

(In fact Hudson is careful to frame his hypothesis as the more neutral view that the world has more than three spatial dimensions, but to keep the discussion as simple and vivid as possible, I will continue to speak as if his hyperspace has exactly four spatial dimensions. As far as I can tell, nothing that I say depends on this.)

Chapter 1. The main nontheistic consideration that Hudson offers in support of hyperspace is his 'fine-tuning' argument. Here is a highly simplified summary. The 'cosmic conditions' (laws of nature, fundamental constants, etc.) that prevail in our 3-space are such as to permit life. But life-permitting cosmic conditions make up only 'a tiny fraction' of all metaphysically possible cosmic conditions. So, if reality consists of just a single, undirected 3-space with uniform cosmic conditions, it is highly improbable that these conditions would permit life; but if, by contrast, reality includes a whole continuum of 3-spaces that vary with respect to their cosmic conditions (as the hyperspace hypothesis asserts), then the existence of life-permitting cosmic conditions somewhere in the encompassing 4-space is highly probable. This, together with a natural principle about the conditions under which an observation counts as evidence in favor of one hypothesis over another, yields the following conclusion:

the observation, O, that there are life-permitting cosmic conditions, counts as evidence favoring the hyperspace hypothesis, HH, over its 'lonely 3-space' competitor, L3.

As Hudson notes, we should be careful not to overestimate the strength of this conclusion: it claims only that O counts as evidence that favors HH over L3; it emphatically does not claim that HH is the only competitor to L3 so favored. Other such competitors that Hudson mentions include traditional forms of theism, a variety of 'many-worlds' hypotheses (e.g., Lewisian modal realism, many-worlds interpretations of quantum theory, etc.), and an assortment of silly-sounding views such as Elvism: "there are a bunch of benevolent elves who live in a spacetime disconnected from ours and maintain the cosmic conditions that govern us" (p. 42). Nevertheless, Hudson's idea is that HH, unlike Elvism, is one of the few competitors to L3 that both (i) renders O highly probable and (ii) has sufficient independent plausibility to be worth taking seriously.

If all of this is correct, it may well be a significant point in support of hyperspace, at least from the perspective of those who reject theism and the relevant many-worlds hypotheses. I would, however, like to register a pair of worries.

First Worry. Hudson ignores an alternative to hyperspace that seems to receive equal support from fine-tuning considerations. According to this alternative -- call it the Interpenetration Hypothesis -- our manifold is spatially 3D but contains continuum-many, non-interacting 'systems' of matter and energy. In effect, the Interpenetration Hypothesis (IPH) results from taking the continuum of causally isolated 3-spaces in Hudson's hyperspace and collapsing their contents onto a single 3-space, while preserving their causal isolation from one another. Clearly, if the existence of life-permitting cosmic conditions is probable on the hyperspace hypothesis, it is also probable on IPH. Moreover, IPH seems to be able to perform nearly all of the other tasks that Hudson assigns to hyperspace throughout the book (though I will leave it to the reader to identify the exceptions).

Although Hudson never mentions IPH, perhaps he is entitled to ignore it. After all, it does seem to conflict with one of the views he lists as his undefended presuppositions -- namely, that it is metaphysically impossible for material objects to interpenetrate without sharing parts. Fair enough, but this would just place additional weight on a presupposition that already seems to be both a priori implausible and perhaps at risk of empirical disconfirmation.

Rather than dismissing IPH on the grounds that it conflicts with one of his presuppositions, perhaps Hudson should argue that IPH conflicts with physics, and in particular with general relativity. According to this theory, particles with mass affect the curvature of the regions they occupy, and the curvature of regions in turn helps to determine the trajectories of particles passing through them. Given this interdependence between the geometrical (and topological) properties of regions and the behavior of the matter that occupies those regions, it is not easy to see how our 'system of matter and energy' could be just one of continuum-many, causally isolated systems all of which inhabit a single manifold but which vary widely with respect to cosmic conditions.

This criticism of IPH is well-taken, but a variant of it constitutes a second worry for Hudson's hyperspace hypothesis.

Second Worry. Consider our 4D spacetime and suppose, with Hudson, that it's just one slice in a continuum of such spacetimes that together form a 5D spacetime. Suppose further that our slice is curved, in accordance with general relativity. In that case it would seem that some of our neighboring spacetimes must also be curved in a corresponding manner. But if so, then these spacetimes and their inhabitants are no longer physically independent of our own. It is natural to wonder whether this form of dependence between slices prevents them from 'varying independently with respect to cosmic conditions' in the manner that they must in order for the hyperspace hypothesis to receive support from fine-tuning considerations.

Chapter 7. Here Hudson appeals to broadly theistic considerations in support of hyperspace: he argues that the existence of hyperspace would give the theist some attractive new ways of dealing with (1) the problem of the best and (2) the problem of evil.

(1) Very crudely put, the problem of the best is this: Our world was not created by God (understood as essentially perfect), for He would not create an imperfect world; and the distribution of suffering (etc.) in the part of the world to which we have access strongly suggests that our world is imperfect. The hyperspace hypothesis, Hudson argues, gives the theist new grounds for holding that, despite the suffering we observe in our part of the world, the world in its entirety is perfect. For if our world consists of a continuum of physically independent 3-spaces, then there is room for God to have created every 3-space worth creating -- not merely our own, imperfect 3-space. Why would God create any imperfect 3-spaces at all, as opposed to filling hyperspace with nothing but perfect 3-spaces? According to Hudson, a hyperspace consisting of every 3-space worth creating (some perfect, some imperfect) is better than one consisting entirely of perfect 3-spaces mainly because the former has an appealing diversity that the latter lacks.

Here I wondered whether Hudson would endorse an apparently analogous principle concerning societies: a perfect society would need to be diverse and so would need to contain some poor, ignorant, unhappy people (whose lives are worth living, but just barely); it could not contain only rich, well-educated, happy people. There seems to be pressure both to deny this principle and to grant that it's relevantly analogous to the principle underlying Hudson's account of the existence of imperfect 3-spaces.

(2) How can hyperspace help with the problem of evil? Consider a dog whose hind legs have been crushed by a falling boulder. The dog is howling in agony. How could God permit this instance of so-called 'natural evil'?

Here is an analogy. Perhaps there is some beautiful 3D shape which is such that, necessarily, anything that has that shape also has some 2D 'cross-sectional' part that is hideously ugly in shape. According to Hudson, the existence of hyperspace would open up a similar possibility. Perhaps there is a certain type T of spatially 4D material object which is such that:

i) necessarily, any instance of T has, as a spatially 3D cross-sectional part, a dog that is howling in agony (presumably mere pain behavior isn't enough), and

ii) any instance of T is so beautiful that its aesthetic value outweighs the evil associated with the suffering of its canine part; indeed, its aesthetic value is so great that nothing of equal or greater value can occur without being accompanied by the occurrence of something at least as bad as the relevant suffering.

So, one reason God might have for allowing such evil is that it is necessarily involved in an even greater, compensating good: a '4D beauty'. Hudson suggests, moreover, that the inaccessibility and four-dimensionality of his beauties make the following claims plausible:

a) we cannot be certain that there is no such compensation for a given natural evil merely on the basis of the fact that we are unable to identify it, and

b) we cannot be certain that nothing is sufficiently beautiful to fully compensate for the relevant natural evils merely on the basis of our beliefs about the values of the objects we know of (which are all 3D).

This is a fascinating proposal. It is not clear to me, though, that there is a need to appeal to anything as outré as hyperspace to achieve these results.

Consider the vast array of properties that: (i) are imperceptible to humans, (ii) can be instantiated only when a dog is suffering intensely, and (iii) do not depend on the existence of hyperspace for their instantiation. Now suppose that the instantiation of some of these properties gives rise to enough aesthetic value to compensate (in the specified sense) for the suffering they require. Perhaps this value can even be appreciated by creatures with the right (?) sort of perceptual apparatus and cognitive make-up. Like Hudson's 4D beauties, these lower-dimensional beauties would escape our notice and would be such that we couldn't confidently estimate their value based on the value of goods we're familiar with. And surely these beauties are no harder to imagine or take seriously than Hudson's, even given the existence of hyperspace.

Chapter 8. This chapter contains Hudson's specifically Christian arguments for hyperspace. He suggests that hyperspace would allow us to reconcile the following two claims about Heaven, Hell, and the Garden of Eden: (i) they are real, concrete, 'flesh-and-blood' places at some determinate distance from us, but (ii) they are not located in the 4D spacetime with which we are familiar. Similarly, hyperspace provides a natural setting for realism about angels and demons that occasionally intervene in human affairs but are typically very difficult to detect. (They normally reside in other 3-spaces but sometimes make forays into our 3-space. Hence the ban on causal processes that cross 3-spaces is not absolute. Hudson does not discuss the relationship between such processes and the laws of nature governing the 3-spaces they cross.) A number of New Testament miracles are explained in like manner.

Hudson's starting points are sometimes unpopular and his conclusions will strike many as outlandish (thus putting him in good company). I have doubts about his case for hyperspace, but it is a new and bold hypothesis, and in my judgment Hudson succeeds in putting it on the table as something deserving continued exploration. Further, there is much in the book that I found completely convincing. Certainly anyone working in the metaphysics of space, time, and objects or in related parts of the philosophy of religion should read this book. Hudson's arguments are so surprising, tightly reasoned, and interesting that everyone will have much to learn from them.[2]

Works Cited

Hudson, Hud (2003) 'Four Colors Do Not Suffice', American Mathematical Monthly 110: 417-23.

Musser, George. (2003) 'Color Madness' Scientific American Magazine, January 2003.

[1] Hudson (2003) and Musser (2003).

[2] I would like to thank Hud Hudson and Kris McDaniel for comments on a draft of this review.