The Metaphysics of Knowledge

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Keith Hossack, The Metaphysics of Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2007, 309pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199206728.

Reviewed by Stephen Hetherington, University of New South Wales


A gripping title and project, much metaphysical rigour, and some underdeveloped epistemology. That is what Keith Hossack has given us. The title of his book trails a bold scent, guaranteed to entice those of us who wander within metaphysics and epistemology. Combine those areas, and excitement beckons. This book's beguiling title suggests a goal of uncovering the metaphysical microstructure of knowledge itself. Not in this case, though, emphatically not. Hossack's metaphysics of knowledge analyses a multitude of concepts other than that of knowledge, with each of these somehow featuring the latter -- which itself remains unanalysed. Hossack's apparent aim (even if he would not describe it in quite these terms) is to build a lot of metaphysics upon a little epistemology.

Why is the concept of knowledge left unanalysed? Answer: Hossack's epistemological inspiration, both methodologically and substantively, is manifestly Timothy Williamson. Thus, knowledge is deemed to be an unanalysable mental state. This is quickly settled, allowing Hossack -- now armed with a serviceable, although unanalysed, concept of knowledge -- to lead us into some dense metaphysical thickets. Which ones? These: concept, content, necessity and possibility, consciousness, persons, language. So much to do; only one book in which to do it. Undaunted, Hossack strides ahead, assured of the philosophical rightness of his mission.

I hope I am conveying that in one way this is an old-fashioned book, while in another way it could not be less so. Metaphysically, it hearkens back to earlier times in aiming to provide a comparatively unified theory of so much. Epistemologically, however, it is of-the-moment in its Williamsonian leanings. I welcome the mix, in the spirit of testing an hypothesis and because that hypothesis is so grand. Indeed, why would any epistemologist not welcome the book's guiding idea that the concept of knowledge is of such importance to so much within metaphysics? With anticipatory glee, then, we pause; where to begin? Ah, a guide beckons: "Over there, we have … a theory of facts … leading on to some remarks about truth … and here -- watch your step, ladies and gentlemen -- is a theory of necessity… . Oh yes, we do have time to sample the exhibit on consciousness… . Walk quickly, though, please."

Facts? Yes, indeed. Chapter 2's theory of facts is vital to the book's enterprise, given Hossack's taking knowledge to be a mental relation to a fact (sec. 1.2). That said, I was surprised at how scant his discussion is of previous theories of facts, such as David Armstrong's. (But it soon became apparent that the perusal of alternative theories is not one of the book's strengths.) Nonetheless, there is much precision and detail, along Hossack's favoured lines. We are given an analysis in terms of combination and vector logic. Thus, 'y instantiates x' is defined as there being a fact which combines x and y (p. 44). Hossack is nothing if not Realist:

the totality of all things divides into two natural kinds, the particulars and the universals. The totality of particulars divides in turn into two further natural kinds, the individuals and the facts: an individual is a particular that combines no vector, and the facts are the particulars that are not individuals. The universals include the logical constants, which are all multigrade universals. (p. 78)

And here is why that is so important:

this ontology is a suitable foundation for a theory of how thought represents the world, at least for those thoughts that can be expressed in predicate calculus. (ibid.)

Hossack's semantics is a picture theory -- 'correspondence … between the syntactic categories of the predicate calculus and the ontological categories of metaphysical Realism' (p. 79). Then (in chapter 3) truth is defined partly via reference, hence partly in terms of knowledge. Knowledge enters the story because reference itself requires knowledge. For instance,

if the definition 'α = the F' is to succeed in making the name 'α' refer to something x, then one must already know of x that it is the F. (p. 121)

In short, Hossack defends a Principle of Acquaintance for reference (p. 117). Consequently, there is a reversal of the usual epistemological approach of analysing knowledge partly in terms of truth. For Hossack, truth is to be understood, at least partly, in terms of knowledge. (Others have suggested epistemic conceptions of truth, Brian Ellis for one. But again Hossack does not link his view with potentially kindred predecessors.)

Now to modality (ch. 4). Epistemologists also often seek to analyse knowledge partly in modal terms. They talk of epistemic modality, thence of alethic modality. Witness how freely they speak of anti-luck counterfactuals, these generally being explicated in terms of possible worlds. For Hossack, though, alethic modality is itself epistemic. There is only a single world; and within it, according to Hossack's proudly old-fashioned rationalism, 'the necessary and the a priori coincide' (p. 127). Kripke was mistaken, and talk of possible worlds may itself be reduced to talk of mentality.

As to mentality, Hossack is especially interesting on consciousness. He offers an Identity Thesis, equating consciousness with knowledge. For example, 'my pain and my conscious knowledge of my pain are identical' (p. 188). More generally, 'all and only those mental states are conscious that are identical with knowledge of themselves' (p. 169). How is this to be understood? The self-knowledge is knowledge of a 'qualitative character' (p. 185). Thus, 'an event is conscious if and only if it is identical with knowledge of its own quale' (p. 186). And 'a unary property μ is a quale if and only if every instance of μ is identical with knowledge of itself' (ibid.). So Hossack's Identity Thesis about consciousness is this: 'C = K, i.e., for conscious mental states, consciousness is knowledge' (p. 181). A striking equation; how far will it take us? This is far from clear. Hossack claims that his analysis 'solves the problem of consciousness completely' (p. 190). Yet he also concedes that his solution 'is only slightly illuminating, since it does not tell us what knowledge is' (ibid.). If it did tell us that, presumably this would render knowledge analysable, which has already been decreed to be impossible.

Let us consider, therefore, more of what Hossack says about knowledge: even if not fully analysable, it is partially describable. He both begins and ends the book with some epistemology, remarking directly and purely upon knowledge. How much does he characterize knowledge itself? How satisfactory is this crucial part of the book?

The first paragraph of Hossack's preface concludes with the claim that 'There certainly exist primitive terms' (p. xi). Then the next paragraph begins, 'The thesis of this book is that "knowledge" is a primitive term.' However, this latter claim is more presumed than proved throughout the book. Hossack's argument even for the former claim (about there being some primitive terms) pays no attention to the epistemologically standard objection that the existence, within each inquiry, of some primitive term does not entail that a single term is recurringly primitive for each inquiry in which it appears.

The key claim made in chapters 1 and 8 about knowledge is that the Constitutive Thesis is false, whereas the Causal Thesis is true:

Constitutive Thesis. Knowledge is constituted by being in the right psychological state in a favourable context.

Causal Thesis. Knowledge is caused by being in the right psychological state in a favourable context. (p. 11)

This is a 'deep' difference, we are told (p. 12). What is the difference, though?

On the Constitutive Thesis, knowledge would be a belief, say, with various apt properties. On the Causal Thesis, it would not. Rather, it would be … well, we need not say what it is, beyond regarding it as something caused by belief, say. Actually, we need not focus only on belief. The Causal Thesis is supported by, for instance, 'the great variety of mental acts and mental states in virtue of which we have knowledge' (ibid.). So, 'we may doubt that knowledge is justified true belief, or any other kind of belief, on the grounds that belief is not the only mental state in virtue of which we have knowledge' (p. 13). Epistemologists have struggled in any case to analyse knowledge in terms of belief, justification, etc. Hossack advocates reversing 'the order of explanation' (p. 26). For example, 'justification can be defined in terms of knowledge' (pp. 26-7), as can defeat, reliability, and warrant.

Now, maybe Hossack is right about all of this. But it has to be said that his discussions of these epistemological ideas are brief. He takes account of few epistemological writings, and he overlooks pertinent possibilities. For instance, here is a potential variation, meriting discussion, on his Causal Thesis:

Causing Thesis. Knowledge causes one's being in the right psychological state in a favourable context.

And here is a hybrid thesis:

Causing/Constitutive Thesis. Knowledge is constituted by causing the right psychological state in a favourable context.

I have argued elsewhere for something like the latter thesis, by conceptually reducing knowledge-that to knowledge-how -- to an ability to manifest some among many various available actions or states. (See 'How to Know (That Knowledge-That is Knowledge-How)', in the collection Epistemology Futures, Oxford University Press, 2006; and 'Knowing-That, Knowing-How, and Knowing Philosophically', Grazer Philosophische Studien, forthcoming 2008.) Like Hossack, I do not regard knowledge as needing to be a belief (or something of that ilk). Like him, I am happy for knowledge to be a relation to a fact. But there are options beyond the two that Hossack mentions, and I wanted further argument from him in this book. Several times, he makes claims as to what is implied by, respectively, the Constitutive Thesis and the Causal Thesis. Almost every time, my reaction was, 'But you haven't articulated the two theses in sufficient detail to enable us to assess your claims as to what they imply.'

Hossack concludes the book by favouring the Causal Thesis because it

declines to assert that every realization of the role states [i.e., functional states which could be suggested as being constitutive of knowledge] causes knowledge. It can deny that a computer simulation of a human being would be conscious, even though it has exactly the right role states; for a computer has the wrong realiser states, since it is not alive. (p. 297)

Yet the support provided here for the conclusion that a computer's functionally apt states need not be knowledge is just that consciousness would be absent -- because, in turn, life would be absent. This is hardly illuminating about knowledge in particular. Symbolically, though, it is the book's final thought. (And recall that consciousness, in any case, is to be understood by Hossack in terms of knowledge.)

I began the book with high hopes; I ended it a touch dissatisfied. That is partly because I continue to believe that knowledge can be analysed -- perhaps not with complete precision, but with some. And although Hossack (in chapter 8) argues against this possibility, he does so quite swiftly, remaining too unaware of further epistemological options to be at all persuasive. (For example, he considers contextualism, but not any more thoroughly gradualist conception of knowledge.) I found some of Hossack's metaphysical discussions fascinating. And he may well have done philosophy a significant Williamsonian service by showing in some detail how central the concept of knowledge should be to metaphysical inquiries. But his metaphysics is founded upon his epistemology. So, as a step towards assessing his metaphysics, we may well wonder how epistemologists, especially, should react to his book. Suppose that he is right about a knowledge-concept's playing a central role in various metaphysical analyses. Suppose, in addition, that only knowledge could play those metaphysically constitutive roles. Even so, it is not clear to me that Hossack has shown that an analysed knowledge-concept could not play at least many of those roles. At most, I suspect, he has shown that a knowledge-concept analysed in some standard ways could not do so. In my view, Hossack needs to provide some further epistemology of knowledge before his metaphysics of knowledge will be sufficiently well-founded.