The Metaphysics of Logic

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Penelope Rush (ed.), The Metaphysics of Logic, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 267pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107039643.

Reviewed by Frode Bjørdal, University of Oslo/Universidade Federal do Rio Grande do Norte


Some questions that come to mind when struggling with certain enigmas belonging to the mysteries of the metaphysics of logic are related to those we would ask if we were considering the metaphysics of mathematics and the metaphysics of formal systems in general. Today, if the topic were to be fully explored, we would expect that attention would also be paid to the metaphysics of computability. In The Metaphysics of Logic such questions do not receive a focused treatment, and the question of how logic is related to mathematics is treated only cursorily. Focus is necessary, and in this collection the focus is mostly on the question whether logic is revisable. Given the volume's provenance we can interpret it as driven by concerns that preoccupy adherents of paraconsistent logics. This does not mean that all the contributors adhere to a paraconsistent point of view, but they nearly all have a tendency to deviate from classical frames of mind so as to marshal considerations that support the view that logic is somehow revisable.

To my mind it would have been good if some of the contributions had appropriately emphasized that logics understood as abstract objects are not revisable and that only human practices, such as the acceptance and use of logics and formal systems, may change.

In "Logical realism", Penelope Rush focuses on whether or not logic may be taken to apply to a world independent of human cognition; the realism she considers holds precisely if logic does apply. "Realism" is, of course, also used in other ways. Rush purports to "show that we can take logical structures to be akin to independent, real, mathematical structures; and that doing so does not rule out their relevance and accessibility to human cognition, even to the possibility of cognition itself." (p. 13). She attempts to achieve her goal by invoking central aspects of Husserl's phenomenological philosophy, and in so doing she suggests that it is by its ability to reject the Law of Non-Contradiction that Husserlian phenomenology is promising in the stated respect.

Jody Azzouni ("A defense of logical conventionalism") emphasizes that while Quine, in "Truth by Convention", purports to refute the conventionality of logic, in reality he poses a dilemma for the idea that logic is conventional. One horn of that dilemma as posed by Quine is that conventions are tacit and based upon initial observations that are only formulated in retrospect long after, just as linguistic conventions are formulated long after in grammar books. Quine discards such a possibility of tacit conventions, but Azzouni attempts to defend it. Azzouni does not offer a clear definition of "tacit convention". Interestingly, he notes that "optimality comparisons should play only a moderate role in an evaluation of what alternative candidates there are to a practice, and therefore in an evaluation of whether the practice is conventional and in what ways." (p. 38). He contends that historical approaches to logic associated with syllogistic reasoning, content-containment and modern rule-governed models of inference all can be taken to characterize modern first-order logic. Moreover, he holds it against the idea that classical logic can be defended as the strongest logic that is truth preserving by claiming that all logics can be taken as truth preserving as they can consistently be strengthened with a Tarskian rule that allows the inference from S to T"S" and vice versa. The latter claim is wrong, given well known limitative results, if our logic includes sufficient arithmetic and, for instance, the axiom schema T"S"S. So Azzouni must not consider formal systems including a modicum of arithmetic to be logical systems. More importantly, the statement that classical logic has truth preserving inference rules is not a statement concerning what inference rules classical logic can be extended with; it must rather be understood as a metalogical statement. If Azzouni had clarified the word "convention" some of his further claims might have been clearer.

In "Pluralism, relativism, and objectivity", Stewart Shapiro writes that he has been "arguing of late for a kind of relativism or pluralism concerning logic" and that "there is nothing illegitimate about structures that invoke non-classical logics, and are rendered inconsistent if excluded middle is imposed." (p. 49). Shapiro follows an idea of Jc Beall and Greg Restall (Logical Pluralism, Oxford 2006, p. 29) that makes the definition of validity relative to cases by a Generalized Tarski Thesis (GTT) so that an "argument is validx iff in every casex the premises are true so is the conclusion." Here x can vary over logics, and the adoption of (GTT) may be taken to support a pluralism about logics. The central claim of Shapiro's paper is that different structures require different logics, and on the basis of this he suggests that mathematics and logic should not deprive itself of the study of beautiful structures exemplified in non-classical systems such as the theory of nilpotent numbers in some non-classical accounts of differentiation.

Solomon Feferman ("Logic, mathematics, and conceptual structuralism") presents anew aspects of his conceptual structuralism, which is an "ontologically non-realist philosophy of mathematics", and his "main concern here is to elaborate the nature and role of logic within it." (p. 74-75). As a professed predicativist in the tradition of Herman Weyl, Feferman is skeptical about the use of the power set of infinite sets. Feferman expresses his predicativism here primarily by a stated skepticism towards the definiteness of the set of all subsets of the natural numbers. As a remedy he presents and discusses some semi-intuitionistic approaches which adopt classical logic for predicatively acceptable statements though use intuitionistic principles for statements that are indefinite in the light of the predicativist strictures. Feferman's chapter is filled with insightful and interesting philosophical reflections and commentaries.

"A Second Philosophy of logic" is a reworked and condensed version of part III of Penelope Maddy's Second Philosophy (Oxford 2007). Maddy's second philosophy is opposed to the idea of a first philosophy and should be understood as part of or a development of the naturalist tradition adhered to, e.g., by Quine. On the basis of rather naturalistic considerations related to psychology and evolution, a rudimentary logic is assigned a pivotal role in human reasoning, and it aligns roughly with classical logic. There are problems (e.g., in the rudimentary logic's idealizations needed to account for vague phenomena) so that the second philosophy of logic does not commit to a first philosophy of logic which would assign logic such characteristics as unrevisability.

In "Logical nihilism", Curtis Franks defends a position that undermines the reader's "taste for a correct logic" (p. 110). His stated method is to lead the reader around a bit (p. 110), and his goal is to draw into question "the idea that one thing a logical investigation might do is adhere to a relation of consequence that is 'out there in the world,' legislating norms of rational inference, or persisting some other wise independently of our logical investigations themselves." (p.110). Franks gives an interesting historical account of the development of logic and offers systematic discussions of some topics. He has a fine section on the law of excluded middle, including the exception taken to it in the intuitionistic tradition. The section also contains some interesting considerations of  ideas that have been used in discussions within and about that tradition, such as some based upon consequences of the structural incompleteness of the intuitionistic propositional calculus. The section also discusses the curious state of affairs that intuitionism in one sense is a weakening of classical logic even though it may, via the negative translation of Gödel and Gentzen, be considered an extension of classical logic. Franks suggests that it would be wrongheaded to choose between classical and intuitionistic logic as the interplays between these systems are the ones that are most interesting. But what about the metalogic needed in such investigations? At this point Franks to my mind invokes a pragmatist attitude as he replies

"why should anyone assume that this amount of reasoning is anything more than ways of thinking that have become habitual for us because of their proven utility? Further, why should anyone assume that there is any commonality among the principles of inference we deploy at this level over and above the fact that we do so deploy them?" (p. 120).

One wonders whether Franks' position should be understood as pragmatist rather than nihilist. In Franks' article as with others in the collection it would have been useful to have had a clarification of the author's distinction, if any, between logic and mathematics.

Mark Steiner ("Wittgenstein and the covert Platonism of mathematical logic") is primarily preoccupied with the interpretation of Wittgenstein's philosophy of mathematics with a focus on his ideas concerning possible contradictions or inconsistencies in mathematics. I do not have the competence to assess these interpretations, so I merely remark that it may be natural for adherents of paraconsistency to be interested in this topic and therefore it is no surprise that the volume includes such a chapter.

In "Logic and its objects: a medieval Aristotelian view", Paul Thom takes up the question of which metaphysical objects logic is about. He focuses on the work of thirteenth century thinker Robert Kilwardby as a representative of the Aristotelian tradition in logic. It turns out that what Aristotle and his medieval followers took logic to be concerned with raises many delicate questions, questions that involve mental and linguistic issues as well as issues about reason or rationality. In his final section, Thom discusses the revisability of logic in the light of concerns raised by other contributors, and he points out that several logicians in the middle ages viewed themselves as reformers of logic.

Gyula Klima's "The problem of universals and the subject matter of logic" is an historical chapter on medieval discussions of universals. It appears very well informed and contains a lot of interesting material. The chapter does not, however, deal with the question which is the focal point of this review: whether logic is revisable or not.

"Logics and worlds" is by Ermanno Bencivenga, an erstwhile logician and, as it were, expressed apostate. It may be correct to say that his current concerns deviate strongly from those that preoccupy academic logicians. On page 183, for example, we are told:

individual calculi cannot be regarded as logics, unless they are part of an ambitious program that extends over a substantial area of experience, indeed potentially all of it. But, whereas most of what falls under the academic discipline of logic does not qualify as logic for me, a lot of traditional philosophy does.

Indeed, Bencivenga mainly manifests a concern for Kantian transcendentalism and related philosophy. His statement "With Hegel, on the other hand, contradiction is not a threat: it is an opportunity" (p. 183) indicates the appropriate congeniality with adherents of paraconsistency to understand the justification for the inclusion of this chapter.

In "Bolzano's logical realism", Sandra Lapointe distinguishes between external and internal logical realism by assigning the former primarily extra-logical reasons for assuming that there are logical facts independent of our minds, whereas internal realists assume there are such facts on account of concerns connected with desiderata for logic itself. In section two she treats Bolzano's Theory of Science. Lapointe interprets Bolzano as an internal logical realist, clarifies a number of Bolzano's innovative concepts, and considers Bolzano a semantical descriptivist. In the next section she clarifies some uses of implicit definitions by Bolzano, and ascribes to him a commitment to a notion of analytic statements. In section four she treats Bolzano's deservedly famous notion of logical consequence and its reliance upon form, and presents his criticism of Aristotle's logic. In her conclusion Lapointe to some extent questions whether Bolzano's notion of logical consequence is fully adequate on the basis of recent scholarship, though she reasonably emphasizes the importance of Bolzano's contributions. The recurrent theme of revisability appears briefly here when she points out that Bolzano's construal of a priori knowledge does not permit an "appeal to subjective justificatory devices such as 'certitude' or 'evidence' to warrant the truth of a priori claims." (p. 208).

In "Revising logic", Graham Priest proposes that logic may rationally be revised on the basis of considerations derived from "the standard criteria of rational theory choice" (p 116); one should have liked to know more about the theory he purports to denote by the invoked term. He has the usual distinction between logica docens and logica utens with lores back to the scholastics. Priest unsurprisingly points out that logica docens, the teaching of logic, indeed has been revised and rationally so. As for logica utens, the logic which people actually use, it should come as no surprise that the logical principles actually adopted by people may indeed change. Priest coins logica ens to designate what we may take as objective logic: "This is what is actually valid: what really follows from what." (p. 211). As concerns logica ens Priest only supports the view that our linguistic practices may change while moving from an old to a reformed logica docens so that what was pronounced logica ens according to the old logica docens may differ from and in some cases even conflict with the logica ens pronounced by the reformist logica docens.

"Glutty theories and the logic of antinomies", by Beall, Michael Hughes and Ross Vandegrift, points out a delicate distinction between the motivation for the revision of logic presupposed in a logic of antinomies LA, by F. Asenjo and J. Tamburino, and the more famous logic of paradox LP going back to Asenjo, with roots in S. Kleene and appropriated by many in the paraconsistency movement. These logics are the same except that LA explicitly distinguishes between glutty predicates and normal predicates. Beall, Hughes, and Vandegrift argue that the consequence relation of LA is somehow more material than that of LP, which is more formal, and that this difference signifies a difference in motivation.

In "The metaphysical interpretation of logical truth", Tuomas E. Tahko argues that the metaphysical interpretation of logical truth must respect a correspondence intuition according to which a "belief, or an assertion, is true if and only if its content is isomorphic with reality" (p. 236). The metaphysical interpretation of truth is contrasted with the Tarskian style model theoretic talk of logical truth by identifying a sentence as logically true iff it is true in all models. Tahko's project includes reconciling some of these matters so as to demonstrate that there is a coherent metaphysical interpretation of logical truth that even accommodates logical pluralism in Beall and Restall's sense referred to above.

This is a good and useful collection, but in my opinion a different title (such as Is Logic Revisable?) would have been preferable. At some points I indicated conceptual problems that should have been addressed. The book will be of interest to professional philosophers and logicians and for advanced graduate students, but I do not recommend it for beginners.