The Metaphysics of Perception: Wilfrid Sellars, Critical Realism and the Nature of Experience

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Paul Coates, The Metaphysics of Perception: Wilfrid Sellars, Critical Realism and the Nature of Experience, Routledge, 2007, 274pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415284455.

Reviewed by Matthew Burstein, University of Pittsburgh at Johnstown


Debates about the nature of perception have been enlivened in recent decades by the development of a family of views (call them "Direct Realist") that, to some extent or other, claim that

perception should not be analysed … as involving an inner experience: perception involves a direct relation between the subject and the perceived object. Perceptual experience is transparent. There are no intermediary entities, such as sense data or sense-impressions, intervening between the subject and what is perceived. (Coates, p. 61)

In The Metaphysics of Perception, Paul Coates offers a systematic critique of several Direct Realist (DR) views, including the disjunctivism of John McDowell and Paul Snowdon and the enactive approaches of Kevin O'Regan, Alva Noë, and Susan Hurley. Coates argues in favor of a Critical Realism (CR) that takes experience to have two components, both of which are to be construed as inner states of perceivers: (i) a "purely phenomenal nonconceptual component … , in virtue of which the subject is consciously aware of sensible qualities" (p. 15) and (ii) a "conceptual component, a thought or 'perceptual taking' that refers directly, without conscious inference, to the external object or event perceived" (p. 5). Although Coates develops a defense of CR based upon the work of Wilfrid Sellars -- drawing on the famed critique of the Given as well as less well-known arguments from later Sellarsian texts -- his project is not, at bottom, a systematic account of Sellars's work. Instead, Coates offers an account of perception that is framed by the work of Sellars but which engages the recent literature on its own terms. As a result, the book provides a systematic updating of the Critical Realist tradition that addresses recent developments in epistemology, philosophy of mind, and empirical psychology.

The narrative arc of the book provides an effective guide for the dense arguments found throughout the work. The opening chapters present a sketch of CR that develops each element of the two-component view, with chapter 1 presenting a basic defense of the CR conception of nonconceptual content and chapter 2 defending a conceptualist understanding of perception. The following chapters (3-5) take up the negative project, arguing that DR is incoherent and that the enactive approaches neither fix DR nor amount to an independent, viable theory. With the ground cleared, Coates mounts a defense of causal theories of perceptio. First, he develops a strategy for solving the problems caused by deviant causal chain objections (chapters 6 and 7), and then he addresses the objection that causal theories cannot explain the "transparency" of perception -- that the phenomenal experience of perception is of aspects of the world, not of inner mental entities that mediate experience (chapter 8). In the final two chapters, Coates turns to the positive project, arguing that the unification of the two parts of perceptual experience comes through the exercise of the productive imagination. The exercise of the imagination allows the subject to conceive of the object of perception and move beyond what is strictly present in perception (e.g. by projecting how the appearance of an object will change if the subject moves around it). I will focus more on the negative project than I will the positive one -- though this is only a reflection of space constraints, not on the quality of the positive project.

Motivation for CR comes from two Sellarsian arguments that are introduced early on: the "Subtraction Argument" and the critique of the Given. The Subtraction Argument defends a distinction between perceptual experiences and propositional thought by highlighting the phenomenological difference between the two kinds of mental events. While the propositional contents might be the same in cases of perceiving that X is the case and of believing that X is the case, the latter can lack the phenomenal state whereas the former cannot. The critique of the Given explains what kind of relationship there can be between the nonconceptual, perceptual episodes and the conceptualized states that agents grasp. Coates reconstructs the "thrust of [Sellars's] argument against the Given as containing at least three central strands" (p. 28):

1. "In order for subjects to have any conscious awareness of their own phenomenal experiences, they must employ classificatory concepts of some sort; a pure unconceptualized awareness on its own would not be a state in which the subject grasps, appreciates, or notices anything at all."

2. "The concepts the subject employs in coming to be consciously aware of phenomenal experience are not logically 'inferred' from that phenomenal state. Nor do they need to 'match' the category to which phenomenal experience actually belongs. Subjects must employ concepts of some kind in order to have a grasp of the fact that they are having an experience of some kind, but the categorical nature of phenomenal experience does not impose itself at the conceptual level."

3. "A subject's 'basic observational beliefs' are conceptually connected with that subject's background beliefs."

The CR analysis of experience, then, is conceptualist in that it requires that "the features of the physical scene that are currently perceptually discriminated by the subject are discriminated by virtue of the fact that the subject is exercising some (perhaps low-level) classificatory concept" (p. 51, emphasis original). Coates's conceptualism is modest because it acknowledges that some elements of nonconceptual, phenomenal experience will not be "taken up" conceptually by an agent; it thereby allows for a role of such nonconceptual experiences. (In contrast, a strong conceptualist holds to John McDowell's claim in Mind and World that "we must not suppose that receptivity makes an even notionally separable contribution to its co-operation with spontaneity" (p. 51).)

As a variety of the causal theory of perception, CR needs a response to the main objection to causal theories of perception: deviant causal chain (DEV) problems. Coates argues that DEV problems are not unique to perceptual cases. Rather, deviant causal chains can be found in manifestly causal, non-mental concepts just as in mental ones. Consider Coates's example (p. 116): we might say that "S is poisoned by X" iff "S is caused to die as a result of X being ingested by S", and yet, if a person "swallows some cold liquid containing arsenic which causes a loose filling in his teeth to drop out, which chokes him to death", we would not say that he was poisoned -- even though the poison is part of the causal chain leading to the victim's death. Because concepts like "poison" unproblematically involve causation and generate DEV problems (i.e. because they require caveats about the "appropriate kind" of causation), DEV problems apply more generally beyond theories of perception; hence, the DEV problem "must in general admit of a solution", and so is not a problem unique to the causal theory of perception (p. 117).

What of DR views, then? Coates mobilizes what he calls "the core argument" against DR views, the ultimate upshot of which is that they fail to provide a "coherent non-causal account of the linking fact that connects conscious experiences with external objects" (p. 78). The core argument raises a "metaphysical skepticism" that challenges theories of perception to specify the linking fact that explains veridical perception and differentiates it from, e.g., "misperceiving some different object … which happens also to be located somewhere" in the environment (p. 73). Causal theories of perception like CR have a natural account of the linking fact: it is the causal relation between the (logically distinct) object and the subject's mental states. In contrast, DR views seem to have difficulty, in the face of such challenges, explaining the relationship between phenomenal experience and the object perceived. While metaphors abound, there still "is no coherent non-causal account".

The foregoing may leave a lingering worry among readers that CR's two-component analysis of perception is a bit antiquated. The advances made by DR views in recent years have meant that we need not (indeed, perhaps ought not) think of our access to the world as mediated by mental states. However, in raising this concern "we conflate the directness of our perceptual takings for the immediacy of the phenomenal states which guide our perceptually based actions" (p. 219). That is, there are two, separable issues here: the direct objects of our awareness and the entities that are immediately present. Even if we agree that our access to the world is mediated via mental states, we are not, thereby, committed to the indirectness of perception. We directly interact with the world, non-inferentially taking it to be full of the objects of common sense experience: trees, tables, people, and so on. But this direct taking of the world with its objects can happen only because "we are causally guided in our perceptual takings and our actions by the inner phenomenal states we are nonconceptually aware of" (p. 193). Here the earlier Sellarsian arguments come into play. The Subtraction Argument motivates CR's two-component view of perception as mediated by mental states, while the critique of the Given shows that the taken part of experience is not inferentially articulated (see (2), above).

Any book of this scope is likely to leave residual concerns; in lieu of making a catalogue of objections, I would prefer to note a more general weakness. While the overall project is compelling enough to deserve serious consideration by DR advocates, many of the parts don't seem sufficiently developed. One such example is the poison case, above. While the point of the example is that analyses of merely causal chains are subject to the DEV objection, the example itself seems flawed. First, one might wonder if the problem has rather more to do with Coates's definition of "being poisoned" rather than having anything to do with causation: one might simply think that Coates has used a definition that isn't sufficient. Minimally, the example would have been more compelling were it more like a Gettier-type case, where we learn that previously held beliefs about knowledge or causation are incorrect because they provide an insufficient analysis. However, we might also wonder if a "final" account of being poisoned, especially one that relied heavily on the biological analysis of poisoning, would be subject to similar sorts of objections. Given that Coates does not want to reduce the common-sense discourse of perception to the scientific one, this worry looms large. Finally, it seems as though this account is not even necessary for being poisoned -- after all, Ukrainian President Viktor Yushchenko was poisoned with dioxin and survived.

While it may seem unfair to pick on a single example in a full-length book, I do so for two reasons: first, it is not an isolated case, and, second, Coates claims that this "single example will serve to show that deviancy is a phenomenon that extends into non-mental contexts" (p. 116). Given the importance of the example to Coates's argument, a much better example is required. Without a defense of the generality of DEV problems for analyses of (all? some?) causal concepts, the fulcrum of his defense of causal theories of perception is pulled out from under its lever; the DEV problem remains a problem for the causal analysis alone.

I do wish to add a word of caution for readers specifically interested in Coates's treatment of Sellars. References to Sellarsian works within the text are made via acronyms assigned to each cited piece, and the separate bibliography for the works of Sellars is arranged chronologically (with acronyms at the end of the entries). The combination of these two features can make it difficult (at least inconvenient) for readers to quickly determine which of Sellars's texts is being referred to.

Ultimately, though, this book is challenging, engaging, provocative, and important. Coates's synoptic account of the metaphysics of perception adds a rich texture to causal theories of perception and revivifies the CR tradition. Indeed, there is something for everyone in this book -- whether as food for thought or as a target of criticism. Due to Coates's deft touch, the book's argumentative balance between depth and breadth ought to further reinvigorate contemporary turns at the perennial debates regarding perception.


McDowell, John. 1996. Mind and World. Harvard University Press.