The Metaphysics of Perfect Beings

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Michael J. Almeida, The Metaphysics of Perfect Beings, Routledge, 2008, 190pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415962933.

Reviewed by Joshua Hoffman, University of North Carolina at Greensboro


As its title indicates, this book examines a host of metaphysical issues surrounding (and implications of) the Anselmian notion of God, 'the being than which no greater is possible'. To paraphrase its author, Michael J. Almeida, its main thesis is that there is no guarantee that we can know a priori many of the claims that have been or might be made about the metaphysical implications of the existence of such a God. This thesis is, of course, in accord with the widely accepted view that there are many a posteriori necessary truths. Almeida maintains plausibly that "major advances in recent years in theories of vagueness, the metaphysics of modality, theories of dynamic choice, the metaphysics of multiverses and hyperspace, the logic of moral and rational dilemmas, and metaethical theory" all call for a reexamination of the implications of the Anselmian God. However, the title of the book is a bit misleading, for its main focus is narrower than that title seems to suggest: for example, there is no discussion of the spiritual nature of God, or of the analysis of omnipotence or of omniscience. There are eight very densely written chapters, all involving complicated arguments that the author invariably formalizes. Many technical terms are introduced without any definition -- a glossary of these terms would have been useful. Given space limitations, I can only discuss some of the highlights and details of these chapters.

Chapter 1 is mainly devoted to stating, formalizing, and evaluating atheistic "arguments from improvability", and, in particular, William Rowe's version. In a nutshell, this sort of argument maintains that (i) if God exists, then God must create a world, (ii) God would not create a possible world if he could create a better possible world, and (iii) for any given possible world, there is a better one that God could create. These premises together imply that God does not exist -- and, indeed, that God is impossible (since the former implies the latter).

A critic could challenge this argument by denying one or more of its premises. A critic could hold, as Leibniz did, that (iii) is false, that there is a unique best possible world (or two or more best possible worlds). Almeida does not consider Leibniz's way out, and, indeed, does not really discuss what makes one possible world better than another. Leibniz, for example, rejects the idea that a hedonistic calculus yields the value of a possible world. Almeida does consider some other attempts to challenge premise (ii). For instance, William Hasker has maintained that (ii) is unreasonable, given that there is no best possible world. Almeida takes Hasker to have argued the stronger conclusion that (ii) is necessarily false. If, necessarily, God exists, there is no best possible world, and God must bring about a possible world, then, indeed, (ii) is necessarily false. Almeida seems to dispute this conclusion, on the grounds that if God does not exist, then (ii) is compatible with there being no best possible world, God's having to create a possible world (if God exists), and God's creating a possible world that is not as good as some other possible world (if God exists). What this dispute seems to show is that since God is a necessary being, whether or not God exists has widespread implications for the modal and truth status of many other propositions. Hence, if God's existence or non-existence is not a priori knowable, then the modal and truth status of those many other propositions may also not be a priori knowable. A final issue is whether or not (ii) follows from the concept of God, i.e., the concept of a perfect being. Rowe thinks that it does, while Hasker, Thomas Morris, and others think that it does not. The solution to this quarrel, I think, depends in part on how we understand omnipotence, but also on several other assumptions, many of which are controversial. I agree with the author's conclusion that the inference to (ii) from the concept of God is not as straightforward as Rowe seems to think.

Chapter 2 considers an argument that the assumption of (iii) leads to a kind of practical dilemma for God (or any perfect being). This argument assumes that God would know what he would do if he were to prefer to actualize a better possible world than the one under consideration, and would know what he would do if he were to prefer not to actualize a better possible world than the one under consideration, and so forth. This kind of self-knowledge, together with (iii), the no-best world hypothesis, and certain plausible-seeming principles of rational choice, imply, Almeida argues, both that God ought (in some sense of 'ought', presumably something like ought rationally) to both actualize the possible world under consideration and not actualize the possible world under consideration (see pages 40-42 for this conclusion). If we add to this a principle the author calls the "rational perfection principle" (viz., that, necessarily, if a perfectly rational agent has a rational requirement to perform an action A, then it does perform A -- call this principle RPP), then we get both that for any given possible world, God actualizes it and does not actualize it. And this, of course, is a contradiction. The author does not always clearly distinguish this contradiction from the proposition that God is rationally permitted and not rationally permitted to actualize any given possible world (see pages 40-42). If we reject only RPP, and retain all the other premises of the argument, we imply that God would be faced with a practical dilemma (or what Almeida calls a "rational dilemma") over which possible world to actualize. Almeida is, however, less inclined to concede this than he is to challenge one or more of the other premises (page 44).

Another very interesting variation on the theme of chapter 2 is Roy Sorenson's claim that moving from a finite set of options to an infinite set does not fundamentally change things with respect to rational choice. Almeida argues convincingly that it does. It seems obvious that if there were a best possible world that God could actualize, then God ought to do so, but it does not seem obvious what God ought to do if there is an infinite set of possible worlds, each of which has less value than many others.

Chapter 3 takes up several attempted theodicies, or defenses of traditional theism against the problem of evil. Peter van Inwagen, for example, has argued that because it is not possible for God both to achieve his aims and to minimize evil, God can create a less than best possible world. The claim is that there is no least evil possible world that accomplishes these aims. Almeida maintains that van Inwagen's argument is inconsistent, and he then examines several attempts to reformulate it, all of which, he concludes, are unpersuasive in one way or another.

Chapter 4 considers arguments like that of Warren Quinn, who maintains that standard theories of rational choice imply that, in certain contexts, one has no good reason to prefer lesser pains to greater ones (Quinn's argument is sorites-like). Some claim that when this sort of argument is applied to the context of God's creation, it can be used to justify God's permitting more evil than is necessary for God's purposes. The author calls this the "problem of no maximum evil" (i.e., the contention that there is no maximum amount of evil that is incompatible with God's purposes). Almeida is (rightly, I think) skeptical about the soundness of these sorts of arguments. I find the psychological assumptions behind Quinn-type arguments questionable.

Chapter 5 begins with the postulation of two principles. The first, "Principle A", states that if it is morally necessary to actualize a state of affairs, A, then A is better than any alternative. The second, the "Moral Perfection Principle", states that necessarily, an essentially morally perfect agent satisfies all of its moral requirements. Together with the assumption that there are infinitely many possible worlds such that every possible world is less good than another, these principles, Almeida asserts, imply that an essentially morally perfect agent faces a moral dilemma. However, as things stand, there seem to be two things wrong about this assertion. First, the Moral Perfection Principle as stated seems to be dubious. It could be argued that an essentially morally perfect agent is only required to intend to fulfill all of its moral requirements -- if it is not omnipotent or omniscient, it might fail to do so without diminishing its strictly moral perfection. It appears that Almeida just misspoke here, and meant for the Moral Perfection Principle to apply only to an Anselmian perfect being, i.e., one that is perfect in every respect. (If Almeida thinks that one cannot be morally perfect without being perfect in every respect, then he owes us an argument to that effect.) Moreover, the inferred moral dilemma doesn't follow unless we assume additionally that the agent in question has a moral requirement to actualize some possible world -- Almeida should make this assumption explicit here, as he does later in the chapter. Given all of this, we have the rationale for Almeida's claim that "Anselmian perfect beings might not be governed by Moral Perfection Principles." The remainder of the chapter explores this possibility, and what moral requirements a perfect being might nevertheless have. Readers should note that when the author, on page 96, formally states what he also calls 'Principle A', it is a stronger principle than the Principle A with which he began -- it is a biconditional version of the original conditional proposition. Now, if I understand his argument, Almeida seems to err on page 99 when he claims that the following is a consequence of (the biconditional) Principle A: for any possible world for which there is a better possible world, a perfect being ought not to actualize it, or is morally required not to actualize it. But all that follows from Principle A is that a perfect being is not morally required to actualize it. This error appears to ruin the argument found in section 3 and in some later sections of chapter 5.

Chapter 6 considers Mark Murphy's objection to what Almeida calls "property-identical divine command theory" (PDCT) -- a theory espoused by, among others, Robert Adams. PDCT identifies moral obligations with God's commands. Murphy argues that PDCT is incompatible with the conjunction of two plausible principles: that moral facts strongly supervene on nonmoral ones, and that God could command different things in the context of the same nonmoral situation. Chapter 6 is Almeida's rejoinder to Murphy.

I don't understand why Almeida thinks that his 1' ("the totality of facts T hold at tn and God commands S to do A at tn") and 2' ("it is impossible that the same totality of facts T hold at tn and God does not command S to do A at tn") on page 115 are compatible with the Free Command Thesis (i.e., the proposition that God could command different things in the same nonmoral situation) and the Supervenience Thesis (the proposition that moral facts strongly supervene on nonmoral facts). The argument he gives for this claim does not seem at all convincing. There may be some equivocation on the part of the author with respect to whether or not divine commands are moral facts.

Chapter 7 discusses puzzles that arise for the view that God assigns different people to different afterlives according to their degrees of goodness/evil. But what if the moral deserts of two people are very nearly the same? Must they then receive the same assignment? Almeida provides reasons why he thinks not.

Finally, chapter 8 considers various nonstandard theories about possible worlds and the universe in the context of trying to reconcile God's perfection with the imperfections in the actual world. Almeida considers, for example, Lewis's modal realism, and Donald Turner's idea that the actual world might be a "multiverse", or complex of universes. One possible objection to appealing to modal realism, however, is that, strictly speaking, it does not allow for the necessary existence of God, since it does not allow for the transworld identity of persons.

Given limitations of space, I have not been able fully to convey the sheer density and variety of argument in this monograph. The overall impression one gets from it is of a veritable avalanche of Zeno-like puzzles and paradoxes, many of which arise from contexts involving infinities -- hence, the analogy with Zeno -- and many of which bear some connection to the problem of evil. Philosophers of religion with a metaphysical bent will find much of interest here.