The Metaphysics of Powers: Their Grounding and Their Manifestations

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Anna Marmodoro (ed.), The Metaphysics of Powers: Their Grounding and Their Manifestations, Routledge, 2010, 196pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415876858.

Reviewed by Troy Cross, Reed College


In a 1974 article entitled "In Defense of Dispositions", D. H. Mellor observed that dispositions were "as shameful in many eyes as pregnant spinsters used to be -- ideally to be explained away, or entitled by a shotgun wedding to take the name of some decently real categorical property" (157). Heavy-handed rhetoric, one would think, but Mellor's invocation of the reactive attitudes was hardly without warrant. To cite but one example of mid-century anti-dispositional moralizing, in Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, Nelson Goodman listed dispositions alongside angels, devils, and classes, as things his "philosophical conscience" simply could not abide (33).

But times, and philosophical mores too, have changed; what was once shameful is now openly celebrated, even preferred. In recent years, a growing number of metaphysicians have repudiated the Humean accounts of laws, causation, chance, counterfactuals, and dispositions that were nearly universally accepted in Goodman's day. Their revolutionary alternative is to build dispositionality itself into basic ontology, claiming either that all fundamental properties are dispositions (pandispositionalism), that some fundamental properties are dispositions and some are categorical (property dualism), or else that each fundamental property is in some sense both dispositional and categorical (the identity theory).

Anna Marmodoro's collection of essays brings together some of the most prominent figures in this recent anti-Humean campaign, along with its critics and scholars new to the debate. Their essays range widely over issues in the metaphysics of dispositions, so widely in fact that they cannot all be meaningfully engaged or even adequately summarized in this review. Most of the discussions, however, cluster around posing or resolving problems for an ontology of fundamental dispositions, and especially an ontology of uniformly pure fundamental dispositions, i.e., pandispositionalism.[1] Rather than summarize each contribution separately, I will therefore focus, as Marmodoro does in her useful introduction, on three challenges for a powers-based ontology highlighted by various essays in the collection: (1) epistemic and individuative regresses that threaten pandispositionalism; (2) a problematic relation between the manifestations of powers and their effects; and (3) a puzzle about how powers are co-ordinated.


The general formula for regress arguments against pandispositionalism is as follows. Dispositions seem, in various ways, to be posterior to their manifestations.[2] If the relevant kind of posteriority is transitive and the manifestations of dispositions are themselves dispositions or complexes thereof, as pandispositionalists would have it, then dispositions are also posterior, in that same way, to the manifestations of their manifestations, and so on. Regress threatens. But what sort of regress ensues, exactly, depends on the kinds of posteriority dispositions are alleged to have to their manifestations.

At least three distinct, even if somehow related, kinds of posteriority are supposed to give rise to vicious regresses for pandispositionalism: truth-making,epistemic , and individuative. Disposition ascriptions are allegedly made true by facts about their manifestations, are known through their manifestations, and finally are individuated by their manifestations. The first sort of regress, based on truth-making, is due to Simon Blackburn (1990) but it does not trouble contemporary pandispositionalists, and I will not discuss it here.[3] The second kind, the epistemic regress, originally Richard Swinburne's (1980), is advanced here by Jennifer McKitrick. The third kind, the individuative regress, is represented by E.J. Lowe.

The Epistemic Regress

Dispositions are detected or observed only when manifesting under their activation conditions. Thus, the water solubility of a substance is detected only when the substance dissolves in water. But suppose for a moment that all properties are dispositions. Then the activation conditions (being-in-water) and manifestation conditions (dissolving) are themselves nothing more than complexes of dispositions. To see whether a substance dissolves in water, then, one would first have to see that the substance has the "being-in-water" complex of dispositions, and subsequently the "dissolving" complex of dispositions. This observation, in turn, could only be made by way of a further set of observations, and so on ad infinitum. Thus, if all properties were dispositional, an observation of a property possession of any kind would require infinitely many "prior" observations.

It is difficult to argue that an epistemic regress isn't vicious, and thus the standard response denies that the relevant priority relation always holds: the epistemic regress halts when it reaches observations themselves.[4] Of course, these regress-halting observations are themselves dispositions, like everything else, but we detect their contents not by first detecting that we are having the observation. Rather, the observation already is a detection of its contents. The epistemic regress stops, in other words, when it runs through epistemic states themselves.

In her essay, "Manifestations as Effects", McKitrick pushes back against this standard response and presents a new and threatening form of Swinburne's argument. Her conclusion is not that pandispositionalism entails that properties are unobservable, but rather that "at most, one property is observable, and that property is the power to cause awareness of itself" (79). McKitrick's argument runs roughly as follows:

  1. The only observable powers are powers to cause observations.
  2. An observable power is therefore nothing more than the power to cause an observation of itself.
  3. On the assumption of pandispositionalism, the content of an observation of such a power cannot be anything qualitative, but must be determined by what it is an observation of.
  4. Thus, the content of an observation can be nothing more than this: "something has the power to cause my awareness of it" (79).
  5. Since that content fails to distinguish different observations, and it is the only perceptual content available to the pandispositionalist, there is only one kind of observation and only one observable property.

McKitrick's argument is genuinely worrying for pandispositionalists, although (i), (ii), and (iii) seem too strong in their present form. I would have thought, for instance, that the inertial mass of an object can be observed, even measured precisely, by pushing against it. But surely, a certain inertial mass, even if it is purely dispositional, is more than merely a disposition to be observed; it manifests whenever the relevant object is accelerated, whether or not anyone is around to witness that acceleration. In other words, some of the manifestations of inertial mass are observations and some are not. But then, either (i) or (ii) is false, for they jointly entail that only powers to cause observations are observable.[5]

It seems to me that (i) and (ii) set an unreasonably high standard for observation, and that if one adheres to such a standard even a categoricalist about properties will be stuck saying that only one's own qualitative states are observable. After all, what is motivating premises (i) and (ii) except the rather Berkeleyan idea that the content of an observation must be only the bare minimum that holds even in skeptical scenarios? Are inertial mass and the like supposed to be unobservable because something could cause the same experiences as a given inertial mass while manifesting in other different, but unobserved, ways? If so, then wouldn't that high standard for observability arguably result in the conclusion that ordinary objects are not observable? For couldn't one have the same experiences while looking at, say, hollowed-out replicas of ordinary objects? Indeed, the pandispositionalist, like every other non-skeptic, should resist McKitrick's implicitly internalist theory of observation, and along with it premises (i) and (ii).

Premise (iii) also falls short of obviousness. It states that observations of powers cannot have any qualitative content. While the pandispositionalist is committed to the proposition that the distribution of mental states, like everything else, is a matter of the distribution of fundamental dispositions, we need an argument that any state that obtains in virtue of the distribution of fundamental dispositions cannot at the same time be a seeming whose content is qualitative, and, moreover, that the nature of this qualitative seeming cannot vary depending on the underlying pattern of dispositions on which the seeming depends. Such an argument, like a non-skeptical motivation for premises (i) and (ii), may be forthcoming, but until then McKitrick's revised epistemic regress argument does not constitute a reductio of pandispositionalism, as she claims. One might instead think of her argument as a call for the pandispositionalist to produce a plausible theory of mind and a theory of perceptual content, which is itself a tall, perhaps impossibly tall order.

The Individuative Regress

In "On the Individuation of Powers", Lowe presents the metaphysical form of the regress. Without pretending to do justice to the nuance of Lowe's subtle and many-pronged attack, I will gloss it as follows.

  1. We need principles of individuation for dispositions.[6] That is, we need something, an individuator, that "determines" or "fixes" which entity of its kind a particular disposition is, something that concerns what Locke says is "the very being of any thing, whereby it is, what it is" (9). Without such principles, "no clear sense" could be made of dispositions (8-9).
  2. Nothing could individuate dispositions apart from their manifestations.
  3. If these manifestations are themselves complexes of dispositions, they too stand in need of individuation by their manifestations and the regress is off and running: if the regress turns back onto itself in a circle, nothing would ever be individuated (13-14, 21).

Lowe is aware of Alexander Bird's innovative response to the regress of individuation, which is to embrace the relational nature of dispositions, allowing that they are individuated by their place in a disposition structure, which Bird shows can be represented neatly in graph theory (2007a). But he objects to Bird's structuralism for three reasons. First, the disposition structure itself is not itself individuated by anything. It is thus unclear what kind of thing the structure is, and indeed even whether it should be called a disposition structure. Second, on Bird's structuralism, knowledge of any one property would require knowledge of the whole structure of dispositions, leading to property skepticism. Third, symmetrical dispositional structures are possible, e.g., there are only three properties and the first is a disposition to cause instances of each of the other two, which are then disposed to cause instances of the first. But such symmetrical structures would not successfully individuate properties, for nothing in the structure would distinguish the second property from the third. As Lowe says, "It surely will not do to proclaim as an a priori truth that the power-structure of any possible world must exhibit asymmetries which permit the assignment of each power in that world to a unique position in the structure" (19).

Without pretending to address Lowe's argument in full, I want to suggest that pandispositionalists would do well to consider its first step (vi), namely, that dispositions stand in need of some principles to individuate them. Pandispositionalists can accept that there are necessary connections between dispositions and their manifestations, e.g., that if disposition D and D* manifest in the same way under all possible conditions, then D=D*, while at the same time resisting the idea that manifestations are in any way prior to the dispositions they manifest.

If this means that by Lowe's lights dispositions have no individuators, then so be it. It is impossible, in any case, that everything be individuated by something else. For individuators are, according to Lowe, prior to what they individuate, and more to the point, they are prior in a way that generates vicious regresses. But if everything is so individuated, then everything is posterior to something else, in a vicious-regress-creating sense of posteriority. Since vicious regresses cannot actually exist, it follows that some things are not individuated by anything else. Why, then, shouldn't the pandispositionalist say that among those unindividuated things are dispositions? (In fact, since they are pandispositionalists, it seems they must say something of that sort, so they must reject Lowe's demand for individuation.) The resulting view would be a kind of structuralism, but one in which the dispositions are not in any way posterior to the structure, but rather either prior to, or perhaps coeval with, the structure.[7]

Lowe argues that analogies to abstract structures are misplaced because, for instance, set-theoretic and number-theoretic structures contain primitively defined elements -- the null set and zero respectively -- and thus escape his individuative regress. But causal structuralists should appeal to a more friendly analogy: substantival space. Spatial points bear unique and essential relations to all other points in a space. Points cannot be stacked atop one another at the same location, nor, arguably, can the same point be embedded in two different possible spaces. Yet, there needn't be any primitive ur-point in space. Moreover, spaces can be symmetrical. A good starting place for a pandispositionalist, therefore, would be to think about why Lowe's arguments fail to disprove the possibility of space, as we typically conceive it.

The Problematic Relation between Manifestations and Effects

A second theme of the book is how to characterize the relation between the manifestations of dispositions and the causal effects of dispositions. Stephen Mumford and Rani Lill Anjum follow George Molnar (2003: 194-198) in holding that dispositions are both polygenic, i.e., they work jointly to produce effects, and pleiotropic, i.e., they always make the same contribution whenever manifested (144). These two features and the tacit assumption that what a disposition contributes to an effect is its manifestation entail that the manifestations of dispositions are not identical to their causal effects. By polygenicity, the effects of a disposition vary depending on what other dispositions are involved in bringing about the effect. By pleiotropicity, the contribution of a disposition itself to that effect, viz., its manifestation, does not so vary.[8] Therefore, disposition manifestations are not effects, but rather some intermediary vector-like quantity that sums with other vectors to yield an effect.

McKitrick warns against introducing these vector-like intermediaries into the ontology. She points out that they are unobservable, because what we observe are always the causal effects of properties, not the invisible vectors that ultimately lead to those effects (81). Further, she asks what kind of a thing these manifestations are supposed to be, critically examining three suggestions: that manifestations are parts of the effect, properties of the effect, or forces. Each of these three suggestions proves unworkable. Inspecting actual causal effects, one simply cannot find either a relevant part or property that corresponds to the manifestation of a disposition, which is supposed to be the same in every case (82). And if manifestations are supposed to be forces, then, since forces are arguably dispositions, we have introduced needless and infinite complexity into the picture, as these dispositions will themselves have manifestations that differ from their effects.[9]

Mumford and Anjum take the analogy to vectors seriously, though they never say exactly what the vectors are, and whether they are themselves powers. Their intention, rather, is to argue that dispositions, and even clusters of dispositions, never necessitate any effect because their contributions are vector-like, and any set of vectors could always be overridden by a new vector pointing in the opposite direction and yielding a different effect (144, 152). Therefore, they argue, dispositionality is a new and irreducible kind of modality, distinct from necessitation: causes dispose things towards certain effects but never necessitate them.

Mumford and Anjum's argument is unpersuasive. It can be granted that any complex of dispositions, D to M in C, may be overridden by some other disposition, O to not-M in C. But the assumption is that there is some principle whereby O wins over D in that case. This principle, it seems, is just a truth about how vectors (i.e., dispositional contributions, or manifestations) are summed, and we have no argument that that is supposed to be contingent. Moreover, it seems that the same vector sum, at least in deterministic cases (where crossing a certain threshold of strength brings about the effect), leads to the same result. And this also does not seem to be a coincidence, else dispositionalists would be closet Humeans.

But if the way that vectors are summed is necessary, and the same vector sum necessarily produces the same outcome, at least in deterministic cases, then there is no need for a distinctive new dispositional modality. Instead, dispositions contribute vectors, the same ones every time, and those vectors are summed in a necessary way, and the sum, at least in deterministic cases, necessitates the outcome, with no magical disposition dust required. Indeed, something very close to the picture I have just sketched seems to be presupposed by Mumford and Anjum's argument: we are persuaded that, in general, causes don't necessitate their effects only because we are comfortable saying what would happen in a certain case, namely, one in which an interferer, and nothing else, is added. But if causes do not ever necessitate, then why think we know anything about what would happen if the interferer were added? Why not simply be skeptical about that possibility, or talk only about what might happen?

Mumford and Anjum might respond that vector sums only tend to produce a given result, but do not necessitate it. But their assertion will either be unrelated to the phenomenon of overriding, in which case we shouldn't be motivated to write a new kind of modality into ontology, or else it will be based on the same argument as above: the vector sum itself could be overridden by the addition of another vector. This argument fails for the same reasons as the original. If the sum is really the sum of all the vectors, then there is no new overrider, for all vectors are already included. If the sum is not understood to be complete, then yes it could be overridden, but the overriding would itself presuppose a principle of vector addition that could, for all this argument entails, be necessary, and another such principle about what happens when various vectors are summed and nothing else interferes. Thus, any such argument based on overriders should fail to persuade the necessitarian.[10]

Markus Schrenk, in "Antidotes for Dispositional Essentialism", sees this issue of whether causes necessitate their effects as a reflection of an underlying tension in pandispositionalism. As Schrenk observes, the movement towards taking dispositions seriously stemmed from C.B. Martin's attack on the counterfactual analyses of dispositions (171). Martin's cases of finkish dispositions, and the related cases of antidotes, masks, and mimics, rely on the idea that a disposition needn't manifest under its typical activation conditions, either because of an interferer or else because the object loses the disposition in its activation conditions. At the same time, dispositionalists want a strong modal connection between dispositions and their manifestations, a kind of connection that distinguishes them from Humeans, who do not convincingly ground counterfactuals, causation, or nomic necessitation. Thus, Schrenk quotes Bird as saying, "Necessarily if the potency is instantiated and receives its stimulus, then the manifestation will occur" (174). It is hard to see how both projects can succeed. If dispositions can always be finked or masked, and thereby never necessitate their manifestations, then how can they cause, explain, and ground effects, and counterfactuals too, any better than standard Humean categorical properties? Mumford and Anjum putatively give up on the necessity of causal connections, yet want to stop short of Humean accidentality as well. Schrenk's advice is, rather, to rethink the lesson of C.B. Martin's cases. We should take Martin's point as merely an epistemic one: dispositions cannot be reductively analyzed in terms of counterfactuals (175). This epistemic point is compatible, of course, with dispositions being supervenient on, even identical to, highly complex counterfactuals.

The Puzzle of Fit

In "Puzzling Powers", Neil Williams asks how a disposition-based ontology ensures that intrinsic fundamental dispositions are coordinated. If dispositions are intrinsic, what prevents the possibility, say, that salt is disposed to dissolve in water, but water is not disposed to dissolve salt (84)? A scenario in which dispositions fail to match might seem conceptually incoherent: how can salt really be water soluble unless water is also disposed to dissolve salt? But we do not want to rule out the possibility solely on conceptual grounds, for the alleged necessity of the coordination of powers is not merely conceptual, but metaphysical. Williams contends that the answer will, indeed, involve some heavy-duty metaphysics: either existence monism, or Platonism, or a brute holism about powers.

Note that if we had a counterfactual analysis of dispositions, there would be no puzzle of fit. What would the puzzle look like? Why can't it be that salt is such that if put in water, it would dissolve, but water is such that if salt were put in it, it would not dissolve? That's nonsense! That's simply the affirmation and a denial of one and the same counterfactual.[11]

The puzzle of fit is a puzzle only because dispositions are taken to be irreducible and intrinsic features of objects that have them. The thought is that if the disposition to dissolve in water is really intrinsic to the salt, then it cannot reach outside of the salt and dictate cooperation on the part of water. Likewise, if water's disposition to dissolve salt is intrinsic to the water, then it cannot reach out and dictate cooperation on the part of the salt. Therefore, to ensure cooperation, something else needs to be written into the dispositionalists' metaphysic. Counterfactuals, by contrast, already take everything into account -- in the salt, in the water, in the temperature, pressure, etc. -- in determining what would happen under various suppositions. Thus, there is no threat of ill-fitting counterfactuals that requires a metaphysical solution. Thus, proponents of sophisticated subjunctive conditional-based analyses of disposition ascriptions have no puzzle of fit.[12]

The puzzle therefore only remains a puzzle for those who think dispositions are ontologically primitive. For the primitivist, one can imagine that powers are like little gods, each with a distinct faculty of will. Each god wills what it wills independent of the other gods. But in the case of conflicting wills, what happens? One might want to rule out this case by constructing one's ontology to guarantee a super-god who, perhaps by creating the best of all possible worlds, ensures a pre-established harmony, so that the gods are always working together cheerfully to bring about the same ends, whatever scenarios they confront. That is, in broad outline, Williams' strategy. But why not, instead, say there are conflicts but the more powerful god always wins out? Maybe salt wants to dissolve in water, and water doesn't want to dissolve the salt, but the salt simply overpowers the water. This seems far-fetched and absurdly metaphorical, but no more than Williams' suggestions that there is "a Platonic blueprint each power follows when instantiated" (99) or that our current pluralistic predicament is the shattering of a once monistic great pane of glass:

Now that great pane is shattered, and our single entity is divided into thousands of entities -- some of which are similar to one another, but many of which are unique. Following the shattering, what were powers had by parts of the pane (for interaction with other parts of the pane) are now intrinsic powers of the many distinct shards. And the fit they have for one another is explained by the holism afforded by their common ancestry. (101)

Williams has done well to spot this puzzle. Dispositions must either compete for dominance, and we must make sense of the metaphor of competing wills, or else they must be coordinated in their efforts, and something must be built into ontology to ensure that coordination. (I fully expect arguments for God's existence along these lines.) Either way, the enemies of primitive dispositionalism will cheerfully add the costs of these metaphysical solutions to the primitive dispositionalist's running theoretical tab.


I have, unfortunately, neglected to discuss several high-quality essays -- Marmodoro's response to yet another regress argument due to Stathos Psillos, Kristina Engelhard's category-theory-based argument for the identity theory, John Heil's broad and insightful response to Peter Unger's recent book, Brian Ellis's defense of property dualism, Alexander Bird's analysis of causation as manifestation, and Toby Handfield's argument for the view that processes, not momentary property instances, are fundamental. Though I could not discuss them here, all of these pieces are just as worthwhile as the essays I reviewed.

On the whole, Marmodoro's volume represents a refreshing turn in the literature on dispositions. There is hardly a critical mention of Humeanism, nor is there a rehashing of the familiar "finkishness" problems facing subjunctive conditional analyses, nor the latest epicycles in state-of-the-art subjunctive conditional analyses. Rather, the impression that emerges from the book as a whole is one of a maturing movement in metaphysics, well past its reactionary, manifesto-penning stage and into a period of rapid, self-critical development. Anyone with an interest in the prospects for a disposition-based ontology should read it.[13]

Works Cited

Bird, Alexander. 2007a. "The Regress of Pure Powers." The Philosophical Quarterly 57 (229): 513-534.

Bird, Alexander. 2007b. Nature's Metaphysics: Laws and Properties. Oxford University Press.

Blackburn, Simon. 1990. "Filling in Space." Analysis 50 (2): 62-65.

Cross, Troy. 2005. "What Is a Disposition?" Synthese 144 (3): 321-341.

Cohen, Laurence Jonathan, and Mary B. Hesse. 1980. Applications of Inductive Logic: Proceedings of a Conference at the Queen's College, Oxford, Clarendon Press.

Goodman, Nelson. 1983. Fact, Fiction, and Forecast. Harvard University Press.

Hawthorne, John. 2001. "Causal Structuralism." Noûs 35: 361-378.

Mackie, J.L., Shoemaker, S., Swinburne, S., Mellor, D.H., Hesse, M., Margalit, A. 1980. "Comments and Replies: The Shoemaker-Swinburne Session" in L.J. Cohen and M. Hesse, eds, Applications of Inductive Logic: Proceedings of a Conference at the Queen's College. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 313-320.

Manley, David, and Ryan Wasserman. 2008. "On Linking Dispositions and Conditionals." Mind 117 (465) (January 1): 59-84.

Mellor, D. H. 1974. "In Defense of Dispositions." The Philosophical Review 83 (2) (April 1): 157-181.

Molnar, George. 2003. Powers: A Study in Metaphysics. Ed. Stephen Mumford. Oxford University Press.

Shoemaker, Sydney. 1998. "Causal and Metaphysical Necessity." Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79 (1): 59-77.

Swinburne, Richard. 1980. "Properties, Causation, and Projectability: Reply to Shoemaker" in L.J. Cohen and M. Hesse, eds, Applications of Inductive Logic: Proceedings of a Conference at the Queen's College. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 313-320.

[1] The term "power", as used in this volume and elsewhere in this literature, is treated as synonymous with "disposition". For instance, Marmodoro writes, "Powers are properties like fragility and electric charge, whose possession disposes their bearer in a certain way" (1), and Jennifer McKitrick says, "I use 'disposition' and 'power' interchangeably" (73). Yet the two terms clearly differ in meaning in ordinary language. Imagine what the sales of Marmodoro's volume would be, for instance, if everyone with the power to purchase it were also disposed to do so. More contentiously, it may also seem that one can be disposed to do things one lacks the power to do, e.g., break one's heroin habit, or buy something that one cannot afford. If there are many impoverished philosophers with a keen interest in the metaphysics of powers but without $125 to spare, then we can say that if everyone with the disposition to buy Marmodoro's collection also had the power to do so, the sales would, once again, be higher.

[2] If dispositions have stimulus conditions or activation conditions as well as manifestations, then those will be prior to dispositions in the same way as manifestation conditions. For an argument that dispositions are individuated by manifestations alone, at least in some cases, see Manley and Wasserman (2008).

[3] Blackburn claims that objects have dispositions by virtue of certain counterfactuals being true, and those counterfactuals are made true by what is true at nearby worlds. What is true at nearby worlds, in turn, is a matter of what things have what dispositions, and thus, is itself made true by what holds at yet other worlds, and so on. Pandispositionalists escape Blackburn's truth-making regress easily, by simply denying that disposition ascriptions are made true by what happens at other worlds. Pandispositionalists say, instead, that dispositional properties are fully actual properties instantiated by entities in the actual world, and that these dispositional properties are what make counterfactuals true, rather than vice versa.

[4] In this volume, both McKitrick and Kristina Engelhard cite Alexander Bird (2007b), but a similar point is made by Sydney Shoemaker. Swinburne's criticism is from a reply to a paper by Shoemaker's at a 1978 conference, and Shoemaker answers that

knowing of a property-instantiation by knowing of (certain of) its effects is only one case of knowing a property 'by its effects'; another is that in which the causal chain by which a property-instantiation produces knowledge of its occurrence does not include the production of knowledge of something else from which its occurrence is inferred -- and no doubt perceptual knowledge is often of this sort. (Mackie et. al., p. 323)

[5] To be fair, this response assumes that inertial mass is not pleitropic, i.e., it assumes that inertial mass can manifest in many different ways, something Mumford, Molnar and others reject.

[6] I lack the space to discuss both, but Lowe actually presents two regresses, one based on the need for individuation conditions and one on the need for identity conditions (8-9). Identity conditions simply provide conditions under which some x of kind K is identical to some y of kind K. Individuation conditions are stronger, and say what the "very being" of a thing is.

[7] Note that what is typically called "causal structuralism" (Hawthorne, 2001) is distinct from Sydney Shoemaker's view that fundamental properties essentially and uniquely stand in a certain set of causal/nomic relations to other particular properties (1998). Shoemaker's view, but not causal structuralism, allows that different sets of properties may occupy the same general causal/nomic structure. Lowe's target seems to be causal structuralism, but Shoemaker's view seems to me still one that could be glossed as pandispositionalist, and it fits my recipe for a response to Lowe.

[8] If manifestations are not contributions, then dispositions will still have something, a "contribution", which is the vector-like intermediary, identical neither to its manifestation nor its effects.

[9] Why not reject pleiotropicity? Indeed, I think this is what dispositionalists should do. However, it does complicate the individuation of dispositions, as Lowe points out:

We can pose a dilemma for those who suppose that a single power could have more than one manifestation-type. Either those supposedly different types fall under a single unified description or they do not. If they do, then there is really only one manifestation-type. If they don't, then what reason is there to suppose that there is really just one power involved rather than two or more -- one for each genuinely different manifestation-type? (11)

[10] Another way to think about this point: a necessitarian could make precisely the same predictions about what would override what, so overriding must be irrelevant to necessitarianism.

[11] For complications, see Cross, pp. 336-338.

[12] How can a counterfactual's being true of an object be intrinsic to the object? Isn't a counterfactual made true in part by the circumstances in which the object exists? Simple. Append a ceteris paribus clause, or an ideal conditions clause, or a normal conditions clause, or a contextually-supplied conditions clause, or, like Manley and Wasserman (2008), quantify over the worlds in which the disposition manifests. All of the contemporary conditional accounts avoid finkishness by making something extrinsic into something intrinsic. Indeed, that is the easiest way to anticipate Martin's counterexamples: unqualified subjunctive conditionals are extrinsic, whereas at least some dispositions are intrinsic.

[13] Thanks to Mark Bedau for helpful conversation and to Sam Kennedy for comments on an earlier draft.