The Metaphysics of Scientific Realism

Placeholder book cover

Brian Ellis, The Metaphysics of Scientific Realism, Acumen, 2009, 179pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652068.

Reviewed by Anjan Chakravartty, University of Toronto



The notion of a “first philosophy” — a maximally general theory concerning what exists most fundamentally, which thereby properly constrains all other forms of theorizing about the nature of the world — is one of the grandest aspirations of systematic philosophy. Brian Ellis believes that an adequately developed metaphysics of scientific realism would constitute such a theory (1, 115), and The Metaphysics of Scientific Realism is his attempt to furnish the development that would make it so. This is an ambitious project, fraught with considerable challenges. It is a matter of ongoing debate, for example, how scientific realism might best be construed. And whatever one’s considered view of realism, it is not at all clear what “the metaphysics” of this position should be. Finally, it is to ask much of the account of natural kinds, laws, properties, causation, and quantum mechanics that Ellis presents, that it succeed in achieving such a lofty goal. In the following, I consider his gallant efforts in the face of these difficulties.

One might think that scientific knowledge furnishes a plausible constraint on theorizing about the nature of reality. After all, the modern sciences are commonly ceded an elevated status among means of investigating the world. This is not an uncontroversial view among philosophers, but let it stand for the sake of argument. To accept this view is still a long way from accepting that scientific realism should have the same status, let alone the metaphysics of scientific realism. How does one get from science to the latter? One might construct an answer to this question on the basis of what Ellis says in chapter 1, where he considers the relationship between science and metaphysics. Ellis maintains that while ‘science … can tell us what we ought rationally to believe on the basis of our observations and experiments … it cannot tell us what would make any belief of ours true in the required metaphysical sense’ (10-11). The sense required is an ontological explanation of the truth of the relevant beliefs, supported by an overarching metaphysical theory whose explanations are typified by ‘metaphysical necessitation’: ‘the relation that holds between things in the world and things that they make true’ (19). Thus, it is the need for this sort of explanation that requires the move from science via realism to metaphysics, in order to identify truthmakers for scientific knowledge.

The need for ontological explanations of this sort, exemplifying metaphysical necessitation no less, is not universally accepted among philosophers of science, and Ellis does not defend this need in the face of alternative (for example, empiricist and pragmatist) approaches to scientific knowledge. The motivation for the project of the book must, therefore, be taken as preaching to the already converted. Australian realists, Ellis notes, demand a metaphysically robust conception of objective truth (17), and the metaphysics of scientific realism will provide one. The second chapter outlines the form that this metaphysics will take, and though some of the proposals to follow will prove more controversial than others, not all of them, it seems, are required to drive the explanatory ontology project envisioned. For example, Ellis prefers an “ontologically oriented” version of scientific realism, concerned with what exists, as opposed to semantically oriented versions preoccupied with truth and reference (23-4). Given the aim of identifying the truthmakers of scientific knowledge, this may seem a puzzling commitment, but nothing to follow hangs on it. Ellis suggests that the reliance in science on devices such as counterfactuals, counterlegals, and idealizations renders much of it non-referential and thus non-descriptive (26-30), but such a view rather overlooks much recent work on idealization in the philosophy of science.

In addition to introducing the ontology of scientific realism to be elaborated in the remainder of the book, chapter 2 also introduces a number of important assumptions. One assumption is that the primary aim of science is to explain; explanatory power is thus the most important desideratum in evaluating theories (25). This choice of the “primary aim” of science is one that is commonly extracted from a list of putatively primary aims (description, prediction, empirical adequacy, fame and fortune, etc.), and though it is unclear what moral certainty could inform any particular philosopher’s choice as to what is primary, Ellis’ selection resonates well with his ambition to extend explanation beyond that which even science can provide by means of metaphysics. The methodology of his enterprise is inference to the best explanation, and the test of a good metaphysical hypothesis is twofold: ‘it must be consistent with the known facts, and be part of a unifying account of reality that explains the overall structure of what we are able to observe’ (123). Importantly, however, Ellis also holds that ‘the aim of ontology is to say what kinds of elements must be supposed to exist fundamentally … to say what kinds of things we really need for an ontological reduction of everything there is’ (34). Simply to assume the possibility of this sort of reduction, and the possibility of furnishing a truly unifying account of reality in terms of any such reduction base, is to court potential difficulty, and I will return to the worries these assumptions may generate for the project of the book momentarily.

The core elements of the metaphysics Ellis proposes are outlined in chapters 3-5: an essentialist view of natural kinds and laws, an ontology of categorical and dispositional properties coupled with a rejection of “strong dispositionalism”, a view of causation in terms of processes and kinds of change, and a realist interpretation of quantum mechanics. Let us consider these elements briefly, in turn.

Ellis is struck by what he takes to be a readily apparent fact about the world: ‘There appears to be an immense hierarchy of substantive natural kinds, that is, natural kinds whose instances are what Aristotle called “substances” ’ (51). Natural kinds are a species of universal, have an objective, mind-independent existence, and may be distinguished by sets of intrinsic properties that are their ’real essences’. There are also, he maintains, a vast hierarchy of dynamical kinds (of events and processes) as well as natural kinds of property instances (tropes) and relation instances. While chemical kinds are a canonical example of Aristotelian kindhood, biological species, though similar in a number of ways, are not natural kinds but rather “cluster kinds” — ‘clusters of morphologically similar organisms whose similarities are due to their genetically similar constitutions’ (59). Ellis contends that this view of kinds has immediate consequences for an account of laws of nature, for the dispositional properties of Aristotelian substances, at least some of which must constitute their real essences, determine their law-like behaviours, which are then described in scientific statements of law.

Interestingly, though Ellis suggests that the existence of natural kinds is readily apparent, he later qualifies this claim by suggesting that their existence is not an empirical discovery, but rather a metaphysical hypothesis proposed in order to explain regularities in nature. The argument given, following J. J. C. Smart, is that in the absence of such explanations the realist is left stranded with the unacceptable notion of cosmic coincidences, which is itself tantamount to ‘scientific phenomenalism’ (53-4). This conflates, however, two aspects of empiricism that Ellis clearly wishes to oppose. The idea of scientific phenomenalism — the empiricist reduction of scientific knowledge to observational data or experience — is detachable from and thus independent of the empiricist analysis of laws in terms of regularity. More importantly for the account of kinds proposed, the emphasis placed on real essences as a necessary condition for natural kindhood would seem to undermine the explanatory project of the book, given that only some sciences (presumably fundamental physics and chemistry) admit of such kinds. A dilemma looms here. Ellis maintains that only kinds with real essences are genuine natural kinds, but if that is so, then the ‘immense hierarchy’ of kinds he imagines collapses into to a relatively diminutive hierarchy. On the other hand, if one takes the scientific-taxonomical categories which might conceivably populate an impressive hierarchy seriously, relatively few satisfy Ellis’ definition of a natural kind.1

Underwriting this ontology of kinds and laws is an ontology of properties and relations, and among the many theses Ellis advances concerning them, two are emphasized above all. The first is that there are at least two fundamental kinds of properties: dispositional properties, which include those commonly referred to as causal powers, capacities, and propensities; and categorical properties, which include spatiotemporal and numerical properties. The main argument in favour of this claim stems from the supposition that dispositional properties form at least part of the essences of natural kinds. If this is so, Ellis maintains, one must make recourse to explanations of their behaviour in terms of the conditions relevant to the manifestations of these dispositions, and these conditions include the instantiation of spatiotemporal properties (and relations; 63, 101). But spatiotemporal properties (and likewise, numerical properties) are not dispositional; therefore, there must be at least two kinds of properties. This leads to the second point of emphasis here, which is Ellis’ opposition to arguments in favour of “strong dispositionalism” — the thesis that there are only dispositional properties.

Strong dispositionalism is sometimes motivated by concerns to the effect that if a property had no causal powers, it could not be known, and furthermore, its identity would depend on a quiddity — a primitive principle of property identity — which is (arguably) more mysterious, metaphysically speaking, than the notion of a disposition. In response, Ellis argues that quiddities are not in fact mysterious, because they are observable; he cites shape as an example of an observable quiddity (105). This is a peculiar response, however, not least because quiddities are by definition primitive principles of identity, not qualitative properties such as shape. That Ellis has something rather different in mind by ‘quiddity’ than his interlocutors is evident in his suggestion that categorical properties, while not themselves causal powers, may nonetheless play causal roles. Given his eagerness to assign categorical properties a role in causation, one might wonder why they could not be bundles of dispositions. (There are historical objections to such a view, but since Ellis accepts the idea that at least some properties are irreducible causal powers (56), presumably he does not find such objections worrisome.) His distinction between dispositional and categorical properties appears to have something to do with the putatively active nature of the former, and the passive nature of the latter. But whatever this might mean, without begging the question, why assume that shape (for example) is passive?

The final pieces of Ellis’ ontological puzzle concern the nature of causal processes and change, and the implications of this for a realist understanding of quantum mechanics. Causation is described in terms of processes involving physical events, which are changes in forms or distributions of energy. Causal processes are ones in which physical systems gain or lose energy, and admit of two natural kinds: temporally extended, continuous processes, which are inertial and transmit energy locally; and spatially extended, discontinuous, instantaneous (or nearly instantaneous) processes, which are not inertial and do not transmit energy. Examples of the latter include radioactive decay, particle emissions, absorptions, annihilations, and quantum wave packet collapse. An ‘elementary causal process’ is one in which there is an emission event, followed by a Schrödinger wave transmission process, followed by an absorption event (83-7). Ellis contends that scientific realists must be realists about Schrödinger waves, and suggests that quantum particles are transmitted as waves but then act in a classically determinate fashion on absorption. ‘The waves must be supposed to propagate particle realisation potentials’ (74); ‘the transmitted wave has the potential to reconstitute itself into a particle in an instant, or at least in a very short period of time, and act accordingly’ (75).

These are stimulating proposals which beg for consideration illuminated by the detailed work that has been done by philosophers in these areas. The concept of a causal process presented here bears a strong family resemblance to proposals elaborated by Phil Dowe and Wesley Salmon. In the considered view of both of these authors, however, physical causal processes are not restricted to energy transmission; they include the transmission of any conserved quantity such as linear momentum, angular momentum, and electric charge.2 The best developed collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics are variations on a proposal by Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber (GRW, 1986), but even on this most refined model of collapse, there are violations of the conservation of energy and momentum (small enough to be unobservable, but there nonetheless). Furthermore, there is no absolute dissolution of superposition: on collapse, the wave functions of particles have tails extending over the whole of space. Such particles are thus not (strictly speaking, according to the property assignment rules of quantum mechanics) located anywhere, which significantly undermines the notion that they “act classically”.3 The details of the literature surrounding causal processes and collapse theories in quantum mechanics suggest that Ellis’ proposals in these areas are, perhaps, somewhat underdeveloped.

What then of the hunger for a first philosophy? Ellis hopes that, developed in the ways he suggests, the ontology of scientific realism furnishes ‘a theory of the nature of reality that can reasonably adjudicate between theories in any field of enquiry that makes assumptions about what there is in the real world’ (1). But this is revealed as a bridge too far. One difficulty already intimated is that, as Ellis himself acknowledges (x), the book is not much connected to nor does it take account of the relevant literature. The rationale for this is that the arguments presented do not much depend on or respond to the work of others, but this may give one pause. The arguments of the book do concern substantive philosophical positions whose strengths and weaknesses have been much discussed, and no account of them can hope to be compelling if insulated from the telling insights of fellow travellers.

A second difficulty concerns the very conception of the project itself. For even if one were to accept the ontology proposed, it would not, could not, and should not constrain much other theorizing about the world. Causation in biology, for example, is not often analyzed in terms of energy transmission, let alone in terms of emission and absorption events connected by Schrödinger waves (nor could they or should they be). Perhaps this worry is best illustrated by the final chapter, which argues for a position Ellis calls ‘social contractual utilitarianism’, exemplifying the idea that moral obligations are social obligations that would be operative in an ideal society. How this might be connected to the ontology sketched earlier, however, is a mystery. It is noted that moral philosophy must be compatible with physical determinism and evolutionary theory (141), and that the relevant categories of moral philosophy (human beings and social categories of individuals and organizations) are not natural kinds (143, 150), but the ontological theses elaborated earlier play no role in this discussion. Indeed, how could they? It is hard to imagine what relevance such theses could have to moral philosophy.

The prospect of constructing a metaphysics of scientific realism to serve as a first philosophy thus remains a grand aspiration. Nevertheless, while those uninitiated in the topics addressed by the book may well not learn here what is at stake in the lively debates surrounding them, initiates will surely enjoy and appreciate this manifesto from one of philosophy’s most important and formatively influential authors in the metaphysics of science.


For helpful conversations on these and related matters, I am grateful to Joseph Berkovitz, Curtis Forbes, Kerry McKenzie, William Seager, and Emma Tobin.


Albert, D. Z. 1992: Quantum Mechanics and Experience. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Chakravartty, A. 2007: A Metaphysics for Scientific Realism: Knowing the Unobservable. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Dowe, P. 1992: ‘Wesley Salmon’s Process Theory of Causality and the Conserved Quantity Theory’, Philosophy of Science 59: 195-216.

Ghirardi, G. 2007: ‘Collapse Theories’, in E. N. Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Ghirardi, G. C., A. Rimini, and T. Weber 1986: ‘Unified Dynamics for Microscopic and Macroscopic Systems’, Physical Review D 34: 470-491.

Salmon, W. C. 1997: ‘Causality and Explanation: A Reply to Two Critiques’, Philosophy of Science 64: 461-477.

1 For a discussion of the relationship between natural kind theorizing and scientific taxonomy, see Chakravartty 2007, chapter 6.

2 For early work on this view, see Dowe 1992 and Salmon 1997.

3 For an overview of the challenges facing GRW, see Albert 1992, chapter 5, and for an overview of the latest developments of the view, see Ghirardi 2007.