The Metaphysics Within Physics

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Tim Maudlin, The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 197pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199218219.

Reviewed by Richard Healey, University of Arizona


This brief but fertile volume develops and defends the basic idea that "metaphysics, in so far as it is concerned with the natural world, can do no better than to reflect on physics." It consists of six essays sandwiched between an introduction and an epilogue. Though written independently over more than fifteen years, in combination they offer a unified blueprint for the construction of a metaphysics based on physics. Maudlin proposes to build on a foundation in which laws of nature and a directed time are assumed as primitives which generate the cosmic pattern of events -- observable or not. Physical modality follows readily, but (he argues) physics does not itself employ a notion of causation. So causal and counterfactual locutions are fit candidates for an analysis that will supplement physical law with pragmatic factors, while metaphysical possibility is suspect beyond the bounds of physical possibility.

In the first essay, Maudlin advocates the view that laws of nature should be taken as primitive, and then uses them both to analyze many counterfactual locutions and to ground the fundamental dynamical explanations so prized in science. He defends the superiority of his view over rival proposals of David Lewis and Bas Van Fraassen, among others. Lewis analyzed natural laws as those generalizations that figure in all theoretical systematizations of empirical truths that best combine strength and simplicity. Maudlin objects that this analysis rides roughshod over the intuition that some such generalizations could fail to be laws in worlds that we should follow scientists in deeming physically possible. Van Fraassen argued that laws of nature are of no philosophical significance, and may be eliminated in favor of models in a satisfactory analysis of science. Maudlin counters that this deprives one of the resources to say how cutting down its class of models can enhance a theory's explanatory power, a phenomenon that is readily accounted for when one takes a theory's model class as well as its explanatory power to derive from its constituent laws.

Laws of Temporal Evolution (LOTEs) are of special philosophical significance for Maudlin. Besides grounding dynamical explanations (as well as some laws of coexistence), they figure prominently in his accounts of propensities, counterfactuals and causation. He distinguishes some laws of temporal evolution as fundamental (modeled on Newton's second law and the Schrödinger equation) from other special laws that hold only in the absence of interference (such as laws of population biology). Fundamental Laws of Time Evolution (FLOTEs) are involved in a 3-step procedure for the evaluation of many types of counterfactuals. First, one selects a relevant time (technically, a Cauchy surface); then one responds to a command implicit in the antecedent to alter the state of the world at that time in more or less specific ways; finally, one applies FLOTEs to determine a second state of the world at another (usually later) time: the counterfactual is evaluated positively (as true or otherwise acceptable) if and only if the consequent is true in the second state of the world. It is because this procedure involves pragmatic factors and background knowledge in addition to the FLOTEs that its results may be uncertain or even indeterminate.

If a relevant FLOTE is stochastic rather than deterministic, multiple second states may emerge at the final step. Maudlin introduces a notion of infection to handle these. Roughly, a second state is infected iff the modifications at step one induce alterations in how FLOTEs produce that state. He suggests that evaluation of a counterfactual ignores uninfected second states that differ from the actual world only through differing in the outcome of a stochastic FLOTE (SLOTE), while acknowledging that this suggestion flouts some people's intuitions. As for propensities, he takes these not to ground stochastic laws, but to follow from them: a propensity for a certain outcome exists just in case a SLOTE delivers an appropriately converging sequence of probabilities as one applies it at times closer and closer to the time at which that outcome might occur.

Chapter two questions the motivation behind Lewis's influential doctrine of Humean supervenience, according to which the laws of nature, along with everything else, supervene on the local distribution of basic qualities. Maudlin decomposes the doctrine into two subdoctrines he calls Separability and Physical Statism. Separability maintains that the complete physical state of the world is determined by the intrinsic physical state at each spacetime point and the spatio-temporal relations between those points: according to Physical Statism, all facts about the world, including modal and nomological facts, are determined by its total physical state. Physics, not metaphysics, decides the fate of Separability. Maudlin argues (pace Einstein as well as Lewis) that the support it received from classical physics has been decisively withdrawn by quantum mechanics, with the entanglement of systems that Schrödinger called the characteristic trait of that theory.

Humean supervenience requires that modal properties, law, causal connections and chance all supervene on the total physical state of the world. Does this much Physical Statism derive support from physics? Not according to Maudlin. He maintains that the total physical state of the world provides a promising supervenience base for physical possibility, counterfactuals, causal connections and chances (insofar as each of these is objective), given the physical laws. But, he argues, while it accords with actual scientific practice to regard them so, it flies in the face of scientific practice to take the laws themselves to be determined by the total physical state of the world. This argument parallels a similar argument from the first essay: they are both subject to the same objection.

Here's the argument. Assume that every model of a set of laws represents a possible way for a world governed by those laws to be. Then each of two incompatible sets of laws may have a model that represents the same total physical state of the world as possible. (Indeed, two incompatible stochastic theories may have identical sets of models, agreeing on every possible total physical state of the world, disagreeing only on their constituent probabilities.) Now it is impossible for a single world to be governed by incompatible laws. Symmetry therefore suggests that a world deemed possible by incompatible laws be governed by neither set. But how can one maintain that laws cannot obtain in a world that is a model of those laws, and hence allowed by them? To avoid this threatened reductio, one must admit that which laws obtain at a world is not determined by the total physical state of that world.

A defender of Physical Statism has a natural reply. By assumption, any laws supervene on the total physical state of some world W. A world W* deemed possible by the laws of W is one whose total physical state determines no regularities that conflict with those laws. But these regularities need not be laws of W*: W*'s laws supervene on its total physical state, not on the total state of W. The metaphor of "governance" is inappropriate: a world deemed possible by laws need not be a world where these are laws, though it must be a world where they "obtain" in the weak sense that their underlying regularities are there respected.

Doubtless Maudlin would object that this reply flouts scientific practice. A physicist must abstract the laws from data provided by the actual world, but, once abstracted, regards them as "floating free" of that world, and so holding by fiat in each situation they deem possible. But this attitude may be squared with Physical Statism. For a scientific interest in physical possibility is limited to applications of laws to the actual world. The Schwarzschild solution represents a scientifically interesting possible General Relativistic world because it can be used approximately to model a system like a planet, star, or other local feature of the actual world. In such employment, of course the system's behavior will be "governed" by the laws of general relativity, insofar as these are assumed to hold in the actual world. If asked whether an infinite, empty Minkowski spacetime is "governed" by the laws of Special or General Relativity (or perhaps some other theory), the practicing scientist should decline to answer, on pain of turning metaphysician.

In chapter five, Maudlin uses hypothetical FLOTEs to sketch a novel approach to causation, in opposition to counterfactual analyses. He constructs two test cases to argue that knowledge that C caused E need neither yield nor require knowledge that if C had not occurred, then E would not have happened (or other more complex candidates for a counterfactual analysis of causation). Then he sketches an account of how laws enter into the evaluation of causal claims.

The key to this account is a basic division between quasi-Newtonian LOTEs and the rest. LOTEs are quasi-Newtonian iff they both prescribe undisturbed behavior and specify how disturbances perturb such behavior: such disturbances then count as the causes of the perturbed behavior. If the applicable laws admit no natural division between disturbed and undisturbed behavior, then we must fall back on a notion of a complete cause -- an earlier state of the world sufficient to prescribe (perhaps stochastically) the subsequent development of a system.

For Maudlin, lawlike generalizations of the special sciences apply to systems only by virtue of, and to the extent permitted by, physical laws. But the basic division applies to all LOTEs. "Those special sciences that manage to employ taxonomies with quasi-Newtonian lawlike generalizations can be expected to support particularly robust judgments about causes." But Maudlin uses an example of McDermott to argue that when we can carve up a situation in different ways to apply alternative quasi-Newtonian lawlike generalizations our causal judgments are likely to waver, even though each partition licenses the same counterfactuals. And he despairs of any adequate analysis of remote causation, where nothing less than complete causes could play the role of antecedents to reliable lawlike generalizations. Whether the world has a rich causal structure at the fundamental level depends on whether the laws of physics take quasi-Newtonian form. But the physical laws need not fulfill a metaphysician's yearning for causes.

In chapter four, Maudlin argues that time passes: along with primitive physical laws, time's passage completes what he calls his anti-Humean metaphysical package. For him the passage of time is neither a mere psychological phenomenon nor an a priori metaphysical truth. Rather, we should believe that time passes because that's what ordinary experience suggests the physical world is like, and nothing in our best physics currently tells us otherwise. But what does this belief amount to?

Maudlin tells us that the passage of time is an intrinsic asymmetry in the temporal structure of the world with no spatial counterpart. Given a classical space-time theory (Newtonian or relativistic), one can represent such an asymmetry by assuming a primitive temporal orientation -- a partition of the time-like vectors at each space-time point into two disjoint sets in a way that varies smoothly from point to point (at least locally), together with a designation of one set as future-directed, the other as past-directed. This assumption is consistent with the metaphysics of a B-theorist who believes in a "block universe" (as Maudlin says he does). Metaphysical proponents of a "dynamical" time would likely refuse to accept it as an expression of the robust sense of passage to which they are committed. (Some A-theorists may even have trouble stating the assumption, given their ontological qualms about future events.) And Maudlin seems to join company with them when he writes that "the passage of time connotes more than just an intrinsic asymmetry: not just any asymmetry would produce passing"; and "The passage of time underwrites claims about one state 'coming out of' or 'being produced from' another". But he admits that time flows only in a metaphorical sense, while seemingly committed to the literal truth of time's passage. The subtlety of this distinction has this reviewer scratching his head!

Maudlin sets out to refute logical, physical and epistemological objections to the view that time passes, culling many of these from Huw Price's influential Time's Arrow and Archimedes' Point. While he scores a few points in the ensuing philosophical brawl, I would call the contest at best a tie; at worst, it is marred by persistent confusion as to what exactly is being fought over. He then presents a case in favor of time's passage. Even here, the case is partly negative. Where Gödel denied that time could pass in a space-time with no foliation by spacelike hypersurfaces, Maudlin counters that the passage of time entails only a preferred temporal orientation. He objects to attempts to analyze change without the passage of time because they cannot account for the directionality of change: attempts to ground this in entropy increase fail.

Besides highlighting the time-asymmetry physicists acknowledge in the laws applicable to esoteric weak-interaction phenomena, Maudlin does offer one interesting physics-based argument for time's passage. Statistical physics explains pervasive asymmetries in our world by postulating an early state that is macroscopically atypical but microscopically typical. Only by supposing that later states are produced by such a state can one explain why later microscopic states are atypical, as statistical physics requires. But for a Humean opponent, it is a contingent aspect of the Humean mosaic that it permits such temporally asymmetric explanations, and another contingent fact that it features creatures like us able to exploit them to good physical (but bad metaphysical!) ends. Still, for Maudlin, arguments from physics remain secondary to what he takes to be our manifest experience of the objective passage of time. Doubtless we all experience world history as one damn thing after another: but this seems an unlikely premise on which to base a significant metaphysical conclusion.

In chapter three, Maudlin locates suggestions for deep metaphysics in the gauge theories of contemporary science. He argues that while a metaphysics of substance and universals may arise as a natural projection of the structure of language onto the world, theories such as the chromodynamics that high energy physicists use to treat the strong interactions among quarks favor a rival, novel ontology suggested by the way in which they apply the mathematics of fiber bundles. Maudlin first argues that not even spatiotemporal relations (arguably the best candidates for external relations) are what he calls 'metaphysically pure' (which I take to be a synonym of the -- equally tricky -- term 'intrinsic'). The argument is that what distance relations obtain between a pair of points depends on the existence and nature of the continuous paths that link them through other points. Next he uses the example of a plane non-Euclidean geometry modeled by the surface of a sphere to argue that whether a pair of vectors ('arrows') attached at different places point in the same direction depends on how one thinks of transporting one vector to the location of the other along some continuous curve linking the two places. The conclusion -- that pointing in the same direction is not a metaphysically pure internal relation -- is then extended to the abstract vectors that contemporary gauge theories use to represent the matter fields associated with quarks and other leptons. He concludes that to refer to a quark as red (as physicists applying chromodynamics are whimsically wont to do) is not to say that it bears a relation of color similarity to other red quarks, since the theory posits no such metaphysically pure relation. Whether two quarks will count as having the same color depends on what space-time path one chooses to connect the space-time locations associated with them. What physicists call color charge is simply not an intrinsic property of quarks, or anything else. "Fiber bundles provide new mathematical structures for representing physical states, and hence a new way to understand physical ontology."

I heartily endorse Maudlin's declaration that "Empirical science has produced more astonishing suggestions about the fundamental structure of the world than philosophers have been able to invent, and we must attend to those suggestions." But if contemporary gauge theories do have any clear suggestions for ontology, Maudlin's is not among them -- or so I have argued in my Gauging What's Real (Oxford: 2007). First, it is not clear how to reconcile the quantum field theories of quantum chromodynamics with a fundamental ontology that includes the quarks whose behavior physicists take them to describe (a point to which some of Maudlin's remarks suggest he is sensitive). More importantly, taking a gauge field such as the (quantized) electromagnetic field to be a connection on a fiber bundle is more than just a category mistake of just the kind that Maudlin warns us against in chapter five: it is to ignore the element of conventionality involved in choosing one out of a continuum of gauge-equivalent connections, each grounding a different path-dependent notion of color-similarity. Classical gauge theories, at least, suggest an ontology in which properties are ascribed to extended loops, in violation of Separability, but still in conformity to a substance/universal ontology, though one of a radically unfamiliar kind.

This is an elegantly written and enormously stimulating book. It is full of original, provocative, philosophical argumentation. Maudlin shows by example what it is to do the best kind of naturalized metaphysics: one based on thorough acquaintance with real science, but unwilling to accept a superficial analysis of how it bears on deep philosophical problems. Every metaphysician should read it and emulate Maudlin's method, even when disagreeing with his conclusions.