The Methods of Bioethics: An Essay in Meta-Bioethics

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John McMillan, The Methods of Bioethics: An Essay in Meta-Bioethics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 186pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603756.

Reviewed by Thomas V. Cunningham, Kaiser Permanente Southern California Bioethics Program


Bioethics is ripe for an investigation into its methods. The boundaries of the field are multiple and blurred, its central problems contested, and its theories and methods are frequently underdeveloped. So, John McMillan's book is a timely one. It positions itself as a pithy exploration of the methodological failings of bioethics and an expert explication of its core philosophical-methodological foundations. Were it able to accomplish this, the book would be an important addition to the field, making for an accessible introduction for an advanced undergraduate or graduate course or a useful reference text for professionals coming to bioethics from medicine, nursing, law, or other vocations. Unfortunately, this book overpromises and underperforms, so I would not recommend it for these audiences. Although it sets out to identify the methods of bioethics, this book leaves out or swiftly dismisses too many significant approaches in the field, including policymaking (beyond merely writing policy well), methods in humanities, empirical bioethics, and methods of administrative and educational work.

Despite this, I recommend this book for those already familiar with the many strains of literature that feed into contemporary bioethics, who will benefit from its polemical style in the first two parts and the refresher on critical thinking in part three. For some in this narrow audience, this book will be frustrating, perhaps inspiring them to reflect upon and be clearer about their own methods when doing bioethics. For others, it may crystalize their pre-existing assessments of the field, providing snappy neologisms to use when encountering well-worn issues yet again. Regardless, for the seasoned scholar in bioethics, this should be a pleasure to read.

McMillan's pith and polemics are evident from the outset as he sets up the motivation for and purpose of the book:

Bioethics has made a mistake about what its methods are, and this has led not only to too much theorizing but also to fragmentation . . . [and] unhelpful disputes between those who think bioethics needs to be more philosophical, more sociological, more clinical, or more empirical. (2)

As a corrective to this, he suggests, "the method common to all bioethics is bringing moral reason to bear upon ethical issues," the understanding of which will enable his reader to identify and avoid "methodological spectres that are obstacles to bioethics being what it should" (2-3). Notably, in the introduction McMillan eschews empirical ethics, saying, "there are many other good books that introduce these methods well, and no books that I am aware of that discuss how it is that you argue about bioethics" (3). These quotes exemplify McMillan's style. While the assessment of bioethics is reasonable enough, so long as we remember that it is specific scholars who should be credited with "mistakes" rather than the field, the bald assertion that some disputes are "unhelpful" would require argument and likewise should be carefully situated in the literature. Along those same lines, the claim that there are many good books on empirical methods yet none on argumentation begs for contextualization. Yet, here, as generally throughout the book, McMillan follows in a bygone philosophical tradition of under-citing the literature. These quotes find no citations and indeed in the entire introduction there are none. So, one is left wondering which many books McMillan has in mind, which disputes he categorizes as unhelpful, what theories are examples of too much theorizing, and so on.

Part one of this essay in meta-bioethics consists of two chapters. Chapter two targets the question, What is Bioethics? To approach an answer, McMillan strives for "an account that illuminates the central purposes, nature, and aims of an area" of study (10). Prudently, McMillan does not search for necessary and sufficient conditions for whether something is bioethics. Instead, he attributes to Margaret P. Battin the notion that a "trichotomy" of activities constitute bioethics. These include clinical consultation (including research ethics), policy development, and scholarship. He also attributes to Battin the notion "that part of the 'core' of bioethics is 'bringing moral reason to bear'" (12) on issues. In addition, McMillan considers whether bioethics should be distinguished from a plurality of related areas of study in this chapter, claiming most related fields to be proper parts of bioethics, including, in his phrasing, medical ethics, philosophical bioethics, empirical bioethics, and missionary bioethics. Of the areas surveyed, only applied ethics and law are deemed distinct from bioethics.

Chapter three shifts the frame to a familiar definition of bioethics as "an interdisciplinary inquiry into ethical issues in the life sciences and biomedicine" and endeavors to demarcate "what makes for 'good' bioethics" (28). McMillan's method here is to canvas a select group of authors all of whom are eminent, though most of whom are male: John Harris, Arthur Caplan, Alastair Campbell, Daniel Callahan, Tom Beauchamp and James Childress, Leon Kass, Judith Jarvis Thomson, James Rachels, Julian Savulescu, and Dan Brock. McMillan summarizes the result of this inquiry as being that he has "shown that moral reason is central to bioethics," which he takes to entail that if purported bioethics activities "fail to even implicitly involve moral reason, they fail to be bioethics" (40). Put more philosophically, McMillan says that good bioethics engages with the experiences of key actors involved in real or hypothetical situations and requires the deployment of moral reasoning to make sense of their experiences.

McMillan's talent for summary is evident in part one. He makes it look easy to find a common thread across disparate discussions, putting these collected wisdoms to his own ends. This skill is especially compelling when he refers to historical moments of the field to inform his narrative, such as the view that there should be "no special pleading" in bioethics, which he attributes to the founders of the Journal of Medical Ethics, who adopt this platitude to signify the normative claim that no discipline ought to be privileged methodologically when assessing papers for the publication (30ff.). Yet, though part one is a neat, quick tour through a collection of well-known authors and lesser-known moments, its importance remains unclear. McMillan's conclusions are uncontroversial restatements of commonplace understandings of the field: Bioethics is interdisciplinary inquiry. Bioethics involves bringing moral reasons to bear on complex, fraught circumstances. Bioethics involves a collection of relatively distinct streams of work. The level of detail McMillan provides here suggests that part one is not intended as an argument so much as a collection of uncontroversial platitudes, with the added gloss of his pet language for explicating them, which will serve as a foundation for an argument to come later. Yet, sometimes McMillan presents this work as though it is an argument, as though he senses there are detractors on the sidelines who need persuading. This portion of the book would be improved by direct engagement with more of them, setting the first two substantive chapters up as a more obvious argument against a foil. This is especially true because McMillan makes plain that the purpose of the book is to educate the reader on how to argue in bioethics, which he takes to be "the basic and general methodological skill" in the field (3). And yet, his modeling of argumentation is lacking.

Yet, this book does have its strong moments. For example, in the next two chapters, which constitute part two, McMillan describes "the spectres of bioethics" (45ff.) I appreciate his crafty writing here, which exemplifies his rhetorical skill:

Spectres haunt and persist beyond their proper time. While we might know and be capable of reciting the reasons why we should not believe in a ghostly apparition that frustrates us, they have a tendency to keep doing so until they have been brought into daylight and exposed as the phantoms they are. Bioethics, as a practice and a body of literature, has a tendency to labour unnecessarily hard under the shadow of some habits and commitments that it would benefit from being freed from. (47)

This is spot on. It captures a familiar feeling for bioethicists who are mid-career and later. It does seem like we are stuck with antiquated conceptualizations of problems we face in our work but that we lack the time, skill, or imagination to develop novel ways of working through them. McMillan's metaphor of bringing these issues into the daylight and exposing them to light and heat to liberate us is enticing.

In chapter four, McMillan sheds light on five ghosts haunting the field: the Moral Mantra, the Tedious Theory Tendency, the Ethics Sausage Machine, Philosopher Kings and Other Queens of the Sciences, and the Snooty Specialist. The first of these refers to McMillan's concern that moral theory is not so valuable in bioethics as everyone seems to think, as it "has a vexing tendency to obstruct rather than enable good bioethics" (48). Principlism (Beauchamp and Childress 2012) is the primary target here, although McMillan acknowledges there are many responses to principlism, including feminist ethics, narrative medicine, and virtue-based approaches. The second specter continues this concern, though now McMillan finds fault with 'theory-driven' bioethics, which he sees as distinct from moral theory, and exemplifies by appeal to Peter Singer's classic work on famine and Westerner's moral obligations. As with the moral mantra ghost, McMillan's worry seems to be that an overreliance on theory leads to conclusions that are unhelpful or merely apparently helpful in practice. In yet another spin on this worry, the third, briefly explicated specter is that there can sometimes be too much insistence on philosophical theorizing in bioethics, where McMillan asserts, apparently unaware of the inconsistency, both that other disciplines can rightly influence what should be meant by how to bring moral reason to bear on issues and that in a weak sense, "all who engage in bioethics are or should be philosophers" (64). The final specter in this chapter conveys the concern that there are times when the bioethics literature appears to devolve into boundary policing between disciplines rather than rich, progressive interdisciplinarity.

A sixth ghost haunts McMillan, to which he devotes the entire fifth chapter, The Fact/Value Spectre. Readers will be familiar with the fact/value distinction. In nearly six pages, McMillan covers Hume, Putnam, Ayer, and Moore on this topic. I wish he had found another page to fit in Quine. Such a light treatment of this longstanding and complicated philosophical problem is likely to be meaningful to neither novice nor expert readers. This is likely to be evermore true as McMillan grafts onto this discussion equally light treatments of objectivism and subjectivism in biomedical policymaking, research positivism in bioethics, evidence-based medicine, and the UK phenomenon of 'values based' medicine.

Altogether, part two best displays McMillan's strengths and weaknesses. His clever neologisms may make readers well-acquainted with the field squirm, but they will also invite reflection and attention to the topics he discusses. He adeptly, rapidly synthesizes broad swaths of the field in condensed chapters. And he reconnects readers with some texts that are likely to be distant memories unless they have recently had the occasion to teach them. Yet, just the same, McMillan practically screams that normative, theory-driven, richly philosophical bioethics is insufficient and "what is needed is serious analysis of what makes good bioethics work" (52). But McMillan does not do this, and he again appears unaware that he doesn't. While the ghosts he shouts at are indeed worthy of consideration, real progress will only follow when someone does the hard work of serious analysis to identify what makes for good bioethics in a comprehensive way that accommodates the rich variation in the field. Perhaps this is worthy of naming a specter after, the Spurious Progress specter, where we each set out to make headway on our problems only to recast them in new lights, without really shedding enough light upon them to take us somewhere meaningfully new. Of course, this is the well-known plight of the philosopher as well as the scientist, if one is comfortable with the Kuhnian frame of normal versus revolutionary science (Kuhn 1962). To be merely a normal scientist is just to toil in the tedium, ever-refining, ever-striving, and yet only ever-redefining the problems of the field until a revolution occurs.

In this way, McMillan's book is a contribution to 'normal science' in bioethics, to stretch this phrase and apply it to an interdisciplinary field rather than a 'science' -- the demarcation problem notwithstanding. Here again is why I believe it is a worthwhile read for experts in the field who are also concerned with the problems troubling McMillan. I find his approach unsatisfying but stimulating, and I think other readers will too. Should one of us find inspiration in our response to his thinking to pen a rejoinder, perhaps someone will begin the revolution.

The last half of the book takes a turn. McMillan moves from focusing on his assessment of bioethics to describing basic philosophical methods with specific examples drawn from bioethics. Chapters six through ten introduce the methods of 'speculative reason' and 'drawing distinctions', including more detailed accounts of giving an ethical argument using syllogisms, using and responding to counterexamples, arguments from analogy, slippery slope arguments, and other methods of argumentation. The sections in chapter nine on futility and McMillan's work as an expert witness are especially compelling, as he deftly delves into difficulties with the concept of futility and earnestly adds to a very small literature on being an expert witness as a bioethicist. Part three could be valuable as an educational resource and I could imagine strategically assigning it to undergraduate or graduate students. There are few other books that concisely combine critical thinking and bioethics (e.g., Dunn and Hope 2018), and part three does this work more comprehensively than they do.

In sum, this well-written 'essay in meta-bioethics' is too meta in the Urban Dictionary sense of the term: it stands above bioethics instead of standing from within it, and in doing so, fails to be reflectively self-aware about the fraught, complex, interdisciplinary place the book aims to illuminate. This is a missed opportunity. Instead of providing a compelling analysis of the methods of bioethics, the reader finds a concise summary of philosophical methods preceded by an impoverished account of bioethics. But I do not see how such a short treatment of the core methods of bioethics could be otherwise, as it leaves so much out. Empirical bioethics can include quantitative, qualitative, and mixed methods research, which span across clinical research, health literacy, medical anthropology, sociology, and history, to name just a few fields where these methods are common. These are glossed over or ignored in this book. Contemporary bioethics also includes significant work in policymaking, such as advocating for changes in conscientious objection laws or regulations. And this is not new -- probably more than any subfield of philosophy, bioethics work has steadfastly contributed to changes in policy, legislation, and legal precedent since its beginnings (Rothman 1992). While McMillan does reference this work, his emphasis on argumentation implies that there is nothing else the work involves, which is misleading and allows him to appear justified in not taking on the more difficult task of explicating how to integrate excellences in policymaking with his discussion of methods of argument. Likewise, significant work in bioethics includes committee work in venues like institutional review boards or hospital ethics committees. While this work certainly involves argumentation, and so McMillan's book is applicable, it also involves administrative work that McMillan omits completely. Finally, bioethics work often involves education, including of healthcare professionals who are usually adult learners in non-degree-granting settings or more paradigmatic learners in academic programs. This book ignores the fact that there are methods to teaching, and these methods are properly a part of bioethics, even if they are not uniquely so and are shared with other fields to various degrees.

In the end, this book mostly left me where it found me. I know bioethics is an interdisciplinary field, roughly covering biomedical and other research as well as healthcare practices, and that philosophical methods are a core part of its foundation. And I am still wondering how other methodologies, especially empirical ones, should be conceptualized alongside those methods to constitute the core methods. Count me among those still awaiting the revolution.


Thank you to Mark J. Bliton for comments on an earlier version of this review.


Beauchamp, T. L., & Childress, J. F. (2012). Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 7th Ed. Oxford University Press.

Dunn, M., & Hope, T. (2018). Medical Ethics: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford University Press.

Kuhn, T. S. (1962). The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. University of Chicago Press.

Rothman, D. J. (1992). Strangers at the Bedside: A History of How Law and Bioethics Transformed Medical Decision Making. Basic Books.