The Middle Included: Logos in Aristotle

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Ömer Aygün, The Middle Included: Logos in Aristotle, Northwestern University Press, 2017, 272 pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810134010.

Reviewed by Anne Siebels Peterson, University of Utah


Aristotle is committed to the importance of properly attuning his methodology to the domain of inquiry at hand -- thus, his logical, physical, ethical, biological, and metaphysical works each have their own philosophical tools attuned to their own specific goals. But at the same time, Aristotle has an array of words that traverse these boundaries to signify key concepts in many -- indeed, even all -- of these domains, as the word "logos" does. An inquiry into any such term faces the profound challenge of being at once highly generic and highly specific. What unity is there to be found across the various senses of logos in Aristotle, and precisely how is that unity further specified so as to be of substantive use in more specific domains of inquiry? Ömer Aygün's book navigates this challenge with illuminating, creative, and detailed attention to the specific inquiries at hand in Aristotle's Categories, On Interpretation, Physics, On the Soul, Nicomachean Ethics, and Politics, while always returning to address the more general unity that each specific sense of logos shares across these domains.

Aygün argues that there are four specific senses of logos at play throughout these works, and that these four senses are unified under a single, more general, sense of logos as an inclusive relation -- a relation that brings its terms together without erasing or undermining their difference. Because "logos" is one of Aristotle's central terms throughout many of his works, such an understanding of logos supports Aristotle's status as a thinker of inclusion rather than exclusion. Aygün's first chapter argues that in the Categories, "logos" signifies "standard" of being -- the standard that identifies, amid the many aspects that may happen to characterize a thing, what it is for that thing to be, but does so without collapsing or eclipsing its many aspects. An inquiry in the second chapter into the concepts of potentiality and actuality in On Interpretation further reveals that this standard must be an actuality inherent to the being at hand, i.e. not merely imposed upon it by us. Natural beings that have an inner principle of motion are, it turns out, those beings that have a genuinely inherent standard of being due to their internal interplay between potentiality and actuality.

Accordingly, the third chapter turns to natural beings in the Physics, revealing a second sense of logos -- as ratio -- operative in natural beings from the lower-level elements to living things with the capacities for nutrition and reproduction. To exhibit logos as ratio is to hold together otherwise separate items in a stable proportion, such as actual vs. natural place, for the elements, and the elements themselves, for living things. The fourth chapter shows this same sense of logos as ratio at work in sensation, between the organ of sensation and the object sensed, as well as in locomotion. Logos in a third sense, as reason, is explored in the fifth chapter through an investigation into the Nicomachean Ethics. In humans, the intermediate part of the soul, the source of desire, increasingly partakes in logos through habit, positive state (hexis), and positive state in accordance with logos. In this latter state, human beings make choices neither in pure conformity to their situation among others in the world (particularly one's family and friends) nor in pure indifference to that situation. Logos in the specifically human sense of reason thereby also maintains the general sense of logos as a tension that dissolves neither of its terms, but holds them together in their difference.

Finally, the sixth chapter introduces a fourth sense of logos as speech through an examination of the Politics. This fourth sense is again specifically human. Human beings are able to both understand (as bees do) and relay (as some birds do) the content of non-firsthand experiences; they are unique among animals in possessing both of these capacities. Indeed, Aygün argues, it is precisely the interplay between these two capacities that allows humans to investigate the sorts of philosophical questions that have been investigated in earlier chapters of the book and to pursue many other domains of inquiry peculiar to us. Logos as reason and as speech distinguishes humans from all other beings, animal and divine.

Aygün's book exhibits precisely the organization needed to balance the generality and the specificity requisite for an investigation of logos by returning, after each investigation of logos in one of its more specific senses, to the relationship between this specific sense and logos in its more general sense. In so doing, the book keeps the reader attuned to the way in which the focused argument made in each chapter relates to the arguments made in previous chapters, as well as the book as a whole. Aygün thus achieves a perfect balance between developing new stages of his overall thesis and, as he often terms it, recapitulation. As promised in his introduction, this structure indeed yields a book comprehensible both to readers who wish to investigate just one section of the argument and to readers invested in understanding logos more broadly. In what follows I will first explore an overarching question the reader may be left with concerning the relationship between the specific senses of logos identified in the book; I will then turn to the book's general methodology.

As I have emphasized, Aygün is exceptionally clear about how each sense of logos identified in specific treatises relates back to the overarching generic sense of logos. This, in itself, is an exceptionally insightful achievement, and, in each case, his explanation of the connection is both convincing and clear. But one thing that is less clear, in the end, is in what sense the four more specific articulations of logos are or are not related to each other directly, aside from their shared general sense of logos as a relation that holds its terms together without collapsing them. For example, in discussing logos as ratio in the Physics, the book often refers back to logos in the sense of an inherent standard: so, in the case of nutrition, Aygün writes:

a new logos, and a new kind of 'stretch' thus emerges with nutrition: whereas natural beings are inherently motivated to hold on to what they are and what it is for them to be (logos as 'standard'), here a living being does so by holding on to contrary elements according to what it is to be for itself, without simply letting one element take over or remain isolated and idle (logos as 'ratio') (83).

The implication seems to be that nutritive beings which exhibit logos as ratio still also exhibit that sense of logos identified in Aygün's discussion of the Categories and On Interpretation, namely logos as inherent standard. But they now do so in a further specified way: namely, by holding on to contrary elements according to that inherent standard. So, is the specific sense of logos as inherent standard still applicable to logos as ratio (and indeed, to logos in its two other determinations as reason and speech)? In other words, is logos as inherent standard indeed one of the specific employments of logos, or is it instead a second generic understanding of logos in addition to the generic sense the book explicitly identifies (again, as a relation that holds its terms together without collapsing them)? Are there, in the end, four specific senses and one generic sense of logos, or instead a more complicated nesting of senses according to specificity and generality? Aygün's book opens the door for future research into questions such as these.

The general methodology that Aygün employs is a dialectical one, where we begin by examining examples which are familiar to us but which may turn out, in the end, to be inadequate. Thus the initial conclusions drawn about logos are not always the final conclusions of the book as a whole, at least not in their fully developed form. Such an approach has many virtues and certainly mirrors that of Aristotle himself; and, to be sure, Aygün's argument for undertaking this method in his introduction is thorough and well-supported through an insightful discussion of Aristotle's own methodological challenges. I want to highlight one place where I see a difficulty with the employment of this methodology, and then relate this difficulty to a broader feature of the book that will help to illuminate the types of audience to which it is attuned.

First, in its initial employment of the dialectical method to discuss logos in the Categories, the book appeals to Descartes's discussion in his Meditations of the mind's superiority over the senses in accessing what it is to be for a piece of wax. It then discusses how Aristotle could view the piece of wax differently from Descartes, focusing in on those features of wax relevant for bees in constructing honeycomb. In the end, however, this example is shown to fall short as an example of a thing with logos because we have no way of showing whether the features of wax relevant for bees are those features that determine its being inherently, as opposed to merely being features that bees (or humans) happen to be interested in. The discussion then moves to the natural examples that Aristotle himself begins with in the Categories: man, horse, etc. At this point, however, one cannot help but wonder if the dialectical method as an investigation of Aristotle has been forced: why not begin with the examples Aristotle begins with? Why move to a discussion of Descartes, when the result of this in the end does not illuminate, but leads us astray from Aristotle's own concerns?

In most areas of the book, however, the dialectical method proceeds more naturally. Indeed, a superb employment of this method is Aygün's discussion of the Nicomachean Ethics, where he begins with the concept of habit, then moves to that of positive state, and eventually to positive states that have logos, connecting them to character and virtue. This discussion clearly follows Aristotle's own progression. And although there are many places in addition to the Descartes discussion where references extraneous to Aristotle come in, i.e., to literature and art as well as to other philosophers, in most cases they genuinely help to illuminate the search after logos as undertaken by Aristotle himself. That said, even when the relevance of these references is more clear than in the example discussed above, the sometimes lengthy discussions of other texts and thinkers can make it difficult to keep track of the argument in its more specifically Aristotelian context. Further, these non-Aristotelian references, especially when the background context is only obliquely referenced, sometimes limit the audience they can reach and may be distracting or confusing. On the other side, however, they may also help readers to form new connections and think about the Aristotelian points in a new light. In any case, understanding the book as a whole does not require a full understanding of any one such reference.

Given its methodology, the book seems best attuned to the scholar aiming to understand Aristotle's engagement with logos generally, along with where this general engagement is grounded in specific texts. It is also attuned to the scholar or student interested in seeing how Aristotle's engagement with logos fits into a broader background of philosophical, literary, and artistic themes. Achieving both of these attunements is, to be sure, no small feat; at the same time, the discussion may not be as useful for the scholar aiming to see how Aristotle's engagement with logos has bearing on contested interpretive points in a particular text. Explorations of specific areas of Aristotle's thought often proceed by assuming standard interpretations, and secondary references are usually given in the endnotes, with general ideas rather than specific claims as the focus of these references. This limitation is, to some degree, only to be expected in a work of such a scope; it is also partly the result of the time spent on discussions of outside sources. The book is also less attuned to the student who lacks sufficient background in the Aristotelian concepts to grasp with relative speed and ease the central terms and ideas of the passages discussed.

On the whole, Aygün's book is remarkable in its scope and depth. It pays heed to logos as a general term that crosses traditional divides in Aristotle's thought, but does so without caricaturing the term's employment in more specific contexts. It holds together both a single overarching discussion of logos as a general term of Aristotle's and many specific discussions of logos in its more determinate employments throughout Aristotle's works, without ever collapsing these discussions into each other or eclipsing one by another. Aygün's book thus artfully exemplifies the very logos that is its overarching subject. In so doing, it serves as an important impetus for further study into "logos" and other key terms that cross traditional boundaries in Aristotle's works. If we are to have a proper understanding of these terms, Aygün's detailed and inspiring work reminds us, we must not rest content with their employment in a single domain only, but investigate them as they are employed in multiple domains of Aristotle's thought, carefully assessing the level of generality or specificity at play in each such domain as it relates to the others.