The Midwife of Platonism: Text and Subtext in Plato's Theaetetus

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David Sedley, The Midwife of Platonism: Text and Subtext in Plato's Theaetetus, Oxford, 2004, 201 pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199267030.

Reviewed by Cass Weller, Universitiy of Washington


The Midwife of Platonism by David Sedley is an enjoyable book to read. It is elegant and engaging, a refreshing reconsideration of the relation of Plato to Socrates. Sedley defends the following provocative thesis: In the Theaetetus Plato pays homage by showing how much Socrates accomplished relying on the substantive principles[1] implicit in his maieutic expertise, a chief accomplishment being aiding in the birth of the Platonic theories found in the Republic and Phaedo.  Accordingly, Sedley finds a distinction between the Socratic meaning of Socrates' words in the dialogue and the reference, intended for those in the know,  to Plato's theories in the Republic and other "middle" dialogues.  Sedley emphasizes the continuity between the views of Socrates of the Socratic dialogues, who, on his reading, reappears in the Theaetetus for a final bow in propria persona, and the views of the author of the middle dialogues. Sedley makes little mention of a later Plato who is closer to Aristotle than to middle Plato. Indeed, on Sedley's view the later dialogues, in particular the Sophist, are able to provide a solution to the problem of false judgment because of Plato's continued reliance on the theory of forms, lacking which Socrates in the Theaetetus falls short despite the promise of the Socratic models inspired by maieutic principles, thought as inner speech, false judgment as other judging, the wax tablet, and the aviary with its emphasis on taxonomy. In turning to a discussion of the wax tablet, Sedley summarizes Socrates' progress toward Plato's  "own eventual solution to the not-being version of the falsity puzzle" with a list of the ingredients at his disposal. (p. 133)

(1) The equivalence between 'not' and 'other than' is a commonplace  of Greek diction as Socrates' apparently casual use of it at 189b4 has subtly reminded us. (2) The analysis of the sentence (logos) into a name  (onoma) and verb (rhema) is by no means a new discovery in the Sophist, but widespread in Plato's dialogues, and already virtually explicit in the quintessentially Socratic Apology  (179b9-c2).  And (3) the appreciation of how beliefs embody assertoric sentences has a specific Socratic pedigree, as I have argued above. What was beyond Socrates, however, was to construct the map of reality which charts and explains the distribution of being-other in the world. That metaphysical enterprise lies at the heart of the Sophist, where it is recognized as a necessary preliminary to the solution of the falsity puzzle. In short Socrates had access to all the ingredients to a successful solution, bar one: metaphysics. (p.134)

Plato needs the metaphysics of the Republic to complete the task of the Sophist, which Socrates is memorialized in the Theaetetus for having begun and almost finished. As for the prospect of answering the central question, what knowledge is, Socrates is on the right track in pursuing the idea of differentiation in the final section of the dialogue. Socrates and the reader go wrong, however, in supposing "that true judgment could ever be converted into knowledge by this power to differentiate." (p. 179)  For  "the fully articulated Platonic position remains that knowledge and judgment  (or 'opinion') are two entirely separate states of mind or faculties, each dealing with its own  distinct sets of objects." (p. 179)

 This represents a sharp contrast to a fairly dominant line of interpretation concerning Plato's development, a contrast Sedley certainly acknowledges and addresses with instructive remarks about authors' relations to their works. (pp. 4-15)  According to a standing, though by no means unchallenged, view of Plato's development, due in large part to Ryle and Owen, the theory of forms of Plato's middle period is criticized in the Parmenides and revised in the Sophist, Philebus, and Statesman.  More important  for our purposes, in the Theaetetus propositionally structured beliefs (doxai)  begin  to come into view as vehicles of truth and knowledge, as does the possibility of knowledge of empirical objects. This represents a shift away from the middle Plato, who had paired sensory objects in the realm of appearance with opinion (doxa) and forms in the realm of being with knowledge. The distinction drawn in the Republic and Phaedo between sense and intellect as a distinction between two modes of cognition corresponding to different types of objects, sensory particulars and ontologically superior forms, recedes in favor of a distinction between sense as source of sensory impressions and the soul's intellectual capacity for simple acts of judgment.

 In this context I think it will be instructive to consider The Midwife of Platonism in its curious  relation to Burnyeat's commentary on the Theaetetus[2]. No other commentator is cited as often and none with greater approval.  Burnyeat's treatment of the first part of the dialogue is framed as a contest between two readings,  one dubbed the A reading and the other the B reading. The A reading is Cornford's, according to which Theaetetus' proposed  definition of knowledge fails because  the proper objects of knowledge are Platonic forms familiar from the Republic and Phaedo. That's the upshot of the argument developed on this view in 184-187. The beings to which perception has no access  are Platonic forms. Thus the dialogue is a kind of indirect defense of the theories found in the Phaedo and Republic. On the B reading, the one Burnyeat endorses, the definition of knowledge as perception fails because the failure of perception to grasp being established at 186a-c is its inability to frame even the simplest propositional belief.[3] The being in question is that of predication. And therefore an act of perception, strictly understood, doesn't even involve minimal classificatory awareness of anything as anything, insofar as the latter requires the use of concepts and this in turn requires the ability to form corresponding beliefs. Platonic forms are completely out of view. Moreover, as Burnyeat sees it, Plato's use of this argument self-consciously corrects the mistake of the Phaedo and Republic, the mistake of treating the senses as a rival source of cognition.[4]

To be fair, Sedley argues, as part of the duality in the text between Socrates, the midwife, and Plato, the parent of metaphysical theories, that one ought not try to resolve the "ambiguity about the scope of 'being', 'truth, and 'knowledge'. (p. 112)  That said, he does commit himself to the idea  that Socrates begins with a thin notion of being, which when applied to the concluding argument at 186c7-e12 would yield the conclusion that "perception's incapacity  to be knowledge lies simply in its inability to entertain propositional thoughts, all of them explicitly or implicitly expressed by the assertion that so and so 'is' such and such." (pp. 111-12) Thus Sedley finds in Socrates Burnyeat's proto-Kantian[5] reading of  the crucial premise in the argument, though he does not mention the Kantian associations drawn by Burnyeat and others.


That's what is striking in Sedley's  account: that, however inadvertently, it reaches back to Socrates to find Kant. That is, by implication it attributes what is in effect the Kantian distinction between sensibility and understanding not to an increasingly critical Plato moving away from the Republic but to the Socratic Socrates relying solely on the principles of midwifery. Moreover, on Sedley's telling, the Socratic claims about being and what it takes to attain it, beyond their dialectical role in the argument, are put on display to remind the reader of their maieutic effect in aiding in the birth of the Platonic theory found in the Republic and Phaedo.  In these dialogues Plato denigrates sense not as too conceptually impoverished to involve something appearing as something but rather as rival source of cognition to intellect. Thus while Plato is grateful to Socrates for being put on the path that leads to the forms as the proper objects of knowledge, he declines the Socratic invitation to the Critical Philosophy.  Less captiously, it seems to me that the move from the doctrine regarding the noncognitive character of sense here ascribed to Socrates to the Platonic thesis that sense is a rival judgment-maker to reason is not one of increasing philosophical sophistication. That's why, I take it, that those who subscribe to this reading of the argument in the Theaetetus also typically see the dialogue as moving away from the doctrines in the Republic.[6]

It is also worth noting that Sedley sees Socrates enriching the term 'being' beyond its initial minimal predicative role to meet the challenge of 186b11-c5, where Socrates distinguishes between two classes of mental acts: sensory experiences available to animals as well as infants and calculations (analogismata)  regarding the being and benefit of the objects of those experiences, available only to those succeeding in a long and arduous education. For if what's at issue is merely the being that one must grasp to form even simple perceptual beliefs of the type, 'That's green,' then one must bite the bullet as Burnyeat does and maintain that the long and arduous education is the process of learning to speak[7]. On the other hand, one might, as does Cornford, take it to represent the progress from the cave to the light as depicted in the Republic.  Instead, Sedley limits the hard-won calculations about being and benefit to what he takes to be within the ken of maieutic Socrates, namely, the calculations about being and benefit pertaining to expertise in the broadest sense.[8]  He thus, in one dimension, tries to split the difference between Burnyeat and Cornford regarding the interpretation of this passage.

One problem with this fix is evident from the idea of enriching the term 'being' beyond its role in the argument refuting Theaetetus. The argument, recall, runs: perception gets no being; what gets no being gets no truth; what gets no truth gets no knowledge. And we're to understand getting being as involving no more than the conceptual competence required for simple belief formation. Now it would be dialectically inept of Socrates to prepare this argument with a digression immediately preceding in which he enriches the notion of  being to the point where for a soul to get being it must become competent at calculations through long and arduous training with success limited to the not so many.[9]   But this is the price one must pay for the initial commitment to 'gets no being' as 'has no concepts', if one is uncomfortable with the idea that the long and arduous education is linguistic training for toddlers.


There are other problems with  'gets no being' as 'has no conceptual competence' to which I now turn. The argument for the crucial premise that the soul grasps the being of something through itself and not through the instrumentality of the senses turns on the fact that being is a common attribute not associated with any sense.[10] And Sedley certainly speaks of being along with sameness and difference as a priori predicates.(p. 106 ff)  The problem is that being can't both be a common predicate in the judgment of a sound and a color that they both are, and play the role of the 'is' that underlies the simplest predication.  For on the latter view, if I understand it correctly, one uses 'is' whenever one predicates, correctly or incorrectly, something of x in a judgment of the form 'x is F', where 'F' is a representative predicate constant not a predicate variable. But in that case 'is' isn't really a predicate at all. It is part of a predicate. If one does express a thought by saying, 'That color is', a specific complement must be presupposed. Thus, to say 'a color is' is either to express an incomplete thought or to say something specific about it, that it is green, for example. In either case we don't have a common attribute that would make sense of judging of a sound and color that they both are. It won't do to say that that judgment abstracts from particular judgments about each, that the one is red, the other C#, if what is meant by abstracting is simply lopping off the predicates, 'red' and 'C#'.  For then we don't have more abstract judgments, just incomplete judgments. Nor will quantifying over the predicate position work. That color is green. That sound is a C#. It doesn't follow that there is something they both are. So what then is it that one is attributing in common to the sound and color in judging that they both are? A more promising answer might lie in the direction of existence as the second-order property of having properties. I'll take up this suggestion shortly.

 As I've indicated, it is typical of this interpretation (gets-no-being-has no-concepts) that perception, by failing to grasp being, turns out to be too cognitively impoverished to involve even minimal classification or identification of sensory features.[11] One, therefore, has to wonder why Plato never explicitly disowns the earlier assumption that to perceive x is for x to appear in some sensuous guise to the perceiver. One also has to wonder just what perceiving as an affection of the soul is supposed to be and what the soul's intellectual capacity of judgment does with it, if it provides no content sufficient for something to appear as something. And finally, the subsequent discussion of the wax tablet model of false perceptual judgment as well as the role of perception in the dream inspired theory would seem to show that perception survives intact as some kind of cognitive resource.

 Let me close by briefly taking up a suggestion that is friendly to Sedley's idea of expertise being involved in the calculations about the being and benefit of sensory objects, and that satisfies the requirement that being be a common attribute. Suppose that the being that perception can't get is existence in the following sense: for x to exist is for it to be something in the sense of having properties. This gives us a common, if not specific, attribute for the judgment that a sound and color both are. Thus, to judge that the sound and color both are is to attribute to both of them the single generic property of having properties.[12]

How will a judgment of x's existence thus construed play out as a necessary condition for a true judgment about x? And what sort of long arduous training will one have to undergo to be able to make such judgments of existence? Here is a possible answer to the first question. On the current hypothesis, if it is true that x is F then there are properties which x has. Further, if  Protagoras believes, truly, that x is F then he must accept the proposition that there are properties that x has. It might seem unduly strong to require that in order for him to believe, in a strict sense, that this is red he must have an idea of what a property is as well as an idea of what it is for x to have properties. But unless he understands that red, for example, is a repeatable feature true of many different things and whose appearance varies with circumstances, he wouldn't really count as correctly predicating redness of something, were he ostensibly to judge that it is red. And unless he has some understanding of this object as an enduring subject of predication, pace Heraclitus, he wouldn't really count as having true beliefs about it. So we seem to be able to answer the first question.

We could even strengthen the property of having properties to that of having a nature. Plato would then be claiming that to be is to have a nature, indeed, one that is independent and yields to ra­tion­al inquiry. This I take to be in conformity with the maieutic principles Sedley ascribes to Socrates and implicit in the collapse of the position of Heraclitus/Protagoras. The further suggestion, then, is that the idea of having an independent intelligible nature is, according to Plato, part of the concept of being, so that to have the thought that x is requires believing that x has an independent intelligible nature. Plato, or Socrates, on Sedley's telling, would then be im­pressed by the fact that perception does not recog­nize that its objects have what Protag­oras and Heracleitus deny that they have, namely, independent natures that determine what those objects are and are not. Nor is perception by itself guided by standards; it takes what it gets. And even if we suppose that on Plato's view to judge that x is red implies believ­ing that x has an intelligible nature and redness is/has an intelligible nature, Plato does not argue that because of its inability to grasp the being of its object and judge that it is, an act of perception cannot involve a minimal belief in the sense of an object appearing in a sensible character to a perceiving subject. At no point does he say that in an act of perception the object cannot be identified as anything. What's wrong with perception is that it does not embody a conception of the world as consisting in objective facts or objects with fixed natures which one may be wrong or right about and which yield to rational inquiry.[13] It is in this general sense that perception has no contact with being and cannot judge of an object that it is. For, judging that x is implies, among other things, that x has a fixed nature occupying a place in an intelligible structure of other such natures.

In what sense then is this general understanding of objects and their properties the product of a long and arduous education? On the one hand, we don't want to require of this understanding that it be explicit philosophical understanding. It might well take someone a long time to come to an explicit philosophical theory of objects and their properties. But then why should that be a necessary condition of being able to judge, truly, that this apple is red? It shouldn't be. The best I can do is to suggest that the understanding at issue is one that develops in people as they come to reflect on the conditions under which ordinary beliefs are true and as they come to appreciate the difference between how things seem and how they are, the very distinction which Protagoras disavows. That is, unless someone, somewhat in the manner of an expert, develops a conception of the difference between belief and the truth it aims at and a conception of intelligible natures to fill out the notion of being at work in the judgment that x is, Plato is urging that we not count him as having genuine beliefs.[14] But this is compatible with supposing that in the absence of such understanding one is guided by mere sensory appearance as a belief-like state.


I offer this view as merely as a suggestion that (i) accommodates what Sedley claims is plausibly ascribed to Socrates on the basis of his maieutic principles, (ii)  satisfies the requirement that being be a common attribute, (iii) maintains uniformity of  the sense of 'being' throughout the passage, and (iv) exploits Sedley's idea of expertise being involved in the educated calculations about being.

As I said, The Midwife of Platonism is an enjoyable book to read, which I recommend to anyone with an interest in the Theaetetus and in the perennial question of Socrates.  This slim volume, written in a modest and accessible style, aims in its own quiet way to overturn an influential thesis about Plato's development. And while the author is no unitarian, those who are, I suspect, are likely to find the main thesis of the book more congenial than are those who see the Theaetetus, Parmenides, and Sophist as marking a distinct stage in Plato's thinking that sets it apart in doctrine from the middle dialogues.



[1] He lists ten principles on  pp. 30-31.

[2] The Theaetetus of Plato. Tr. M.J.Levett revised by Myles Burnyeat. Hackett, Indianpolis: 1990. See also M.F.Burnyeat. "Plato on the Grammar of Perceiving." Classical Quarterly 70 (1976), pp.49-50.

[3] A similar view can be found in  Michael Frede , "Observations on Perception in Plato's Later Dialogues," in Essays in Ancient Philosophy. University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis: 1987.

[4] "The charge [there]  against perception is that it offers itself as a dangerously seductive  rival judgment-maker  to reason." Burnyeat (1990)  60-1.

[5] I say 'proto-Kantian' in deference to earlier writers who explicitly see Plato anticipating Kant's refutation of empiricism and  who unabashedly describe Plato's argument in the technical terminology of the Critical Philosophy. See, for example, P.Natorp (Plato's Ideenlehre. Meiner, Leipzig: 1903, pp.108-116) and O.Apelt (Platons Dialogue Theaitetos. Leipzig: Meiner, 1913, pp.169ff., n.47); Platonische Aufsätze. Teubner Leipzig: 1912, p.37)). These interpreters think that Plato is drawing a distinc­tion between sense and intellect in terms of receptivity and spontaneity, i.e., raw uncategorized intuitions and concepts of the understanding.

[6] Sedley does tangentially address this issue by challenging one aspect of the supposedly Kantian advance over the Republic.(p. 113 ff.)  Burnyeat had originally claimed (Burnyeat 1970,1990) that the image at 184d of the senses as autonomous agents in a wooden horse was meant to refer to the model of perception to be found at Republic 523a. Here in the Theaeatetus Plato corrects this failure to do justice to the unity of consciousness. Sedley argues against the wooden-horse reading of the Republic and thus that  no correction is needed.  This defense of the Republic does not, however,  address the point I have made. That said, I should also mention here that Sedley doesn't claim that the author of the Theaetetus  simply endorses without qualification every Platonic doctrine of the Republic. Regarding the scope of dialectical investigation he speaks of a " return to a less exclusionist and more Socratic outlook", claiming that "we find in the Theaetetus  the rediscovery of a Socratic legacy which points forward  to Plato's late work." (p.108)

[7] One difficulty with this maneuver  is that it must ignore the implication that success seems limited to the few, an implication that Sedley also notes (110)

[8] This is somewhat akin to Cooper's view, although Cooper makes the contact with the earlier refutation of Protagoras explicit. See   J. M. Cooper.  "Plato on Sense-Perception and Knowledge: Theaetetus 184-186," Phronesis, 15, 1970: 123-46.

[9] One can  argue that there is a gap between what it takes to judge of a color that it is, that is, to grasp its being, and the educated calculations about the being of the color, while maintaining that the notion of being  is the same. It would, however, still be misleading of Socrates to be emphasizing the gap between perceptual experiences available to brutes and babes and educated judgments about being, if the crucial contrast is between the former and simpler judgments about being. 

[10] I am  assuming an equivalence between judging of x that it is and grasping the being of x.

[11] Sedley is not as explicit about this as Burnyeat is. (Burnyeat 1990, 61-65)

[12] This needn't force a parallel treatment of  not-being as non-existence construed as the failure to have any properties at all. To judge that x is not is just to judge that something (F), no attribute in particular, which others may predicatively be, is what x (predicatively) is not.

[13] This is Cooper's basic point. (1970, 141-44) He stresses the fact that perception is a Protagorean faculty through which objects appear but does not include the capacity for drawing a distinction between what appears and what is real.

[14] One might argue that this education perfectly coincides with simply being trained to speak. I would respond that Plato is elitist enough to dismiss mere linguistic competence and the naïve realism embedded therein as the kind of expertise at issue. It's not surprising that Plato or Socrates would  impose fairly strong internalist requirements on judgment and knowledge and set the bar rather high for being a player in the knowledge-game.