The Mighty and the Almighty: An Essay in Political Theology

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Nicholas Wolterstorff, The Mighty and the Almighty: An Essay in Political Theology, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 181pp., $94.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107027312.

Reviewed by Kristen Irwin, Biola University


This is the first of Nicholas Wolterstorff's two 2012 books on political philosophy. While Understanding Liberal Democracy (Oxford, 2012) is a comprehensive treatment of contemporary liberal democratic theory, The Mighty and the Almighty takes on the more modest task of theorizing a political theology for the Christian.[1] (The latter task is surely only a modest one when compared with the former!) Wolterstorff has been working on these issues for many years (see, e.g., his 1983 Until Justice and Peace Embrace), and this book originated in his 1998 Stone Lectures at Princeton, delivered on the centenary of Abraham Kuyper's own Stone Lectures. This relatively brief text retains both the advantages and the disadvantages of its original lecture format: astonishingly clear and accessible, but a relatively light sketch given the complexity of the topic.

Despite the specifically Christian orientation of his project, Wolterstorff asks for the attention of the nonreligious: "In a participatory democracy such as ours, it's important that we each be open with and open to our fellow citizens concerning the deep sources of how we think about political issues" (8). This is the first shot across the bow of what Wolterstorff calls "public reason liberalism", which eschews sectarian reasons in political discourse in favor of public ones. Wolterstorff claims that the "dream [of public reason liberalism] has failed" (9): present-day disagreements over political issues are as intractable as ever. In that environment, why not give political theology a try in the "space of reasons"? Though political theology is not nearly so popular as in the days of Augustine or Calvin -- two of Wolterstorff's foils -- Wolterstorff argues that it's overdue for careful contemporary consideration.

This is just what Wolterstorff proposes to offer: a substantive account of the relationship between political authority and divine authority. It's a happy coincidence that such an account segues nicely into a case for the liberal democratic state, "albeit for a less individualistic understanding of the liberal democratic state than is common" (5).

An interesting implication of his account is that it pits Wolterstorff against a cadre of contemporary Christian scholars such as Stanley Hauerwas and William H. Willimon[2] who argue that the liberal democratic state is fundamentally at odds with Christian loyalty to the church. The "Christian as foreigner" line of thinking has deep antecedents in the history of Christian thought, beginning with Augustine's "two cities" doctrine: Christians are "resident aliens", and as such, the authority of the state binds them in much the same way as "aliens residing or traveling in its territory" (36). A more radical assertion of the independence of the Christian from the authority of the state is John Howard Yoder's position: the state has no authority at all, but merely coercive power (18).

Wolterstorff will have none of this. In contrast to these attempts to dissolve the tension between political and divine authority, Wolterstorff articulates two dualities that define the situation of the Christian as citizen of a state. The first duality is that "political authority mediates divine authority while at the same time being limited and placed under judgment by divine authority" (16). The tension in this duality is most obvious when the state issues directives that it does not have the "performance authority" to issue (65). In Chapter 6, Wolterstorff develops an account of political authority as "the de jure authority of the state to govern the public" (66). The second duality is that "as a citizen of some state [the Christian] is under its authority, it in turn being under God's authority; as a member of the church [the Christian] is under its authority, it in turn being under Christ's authority" (18). The tension in this duality is most obvious when the state issues directives that infringe upon the institutional rights of the church. In Chapter 14, Wolterstorff develops an account of how the existence of institutions with governance-authority structures "places normative limits on the authority of the state" (157).

Wolterstorff begins with a general account of the phenomena in question -- authority and governance -- and then applies that general framework to the specific context at hand: the authority of the state to govern. Thus, Chapter 4 is a discussion of the nature of authority in general, with specific accounts of performance-authority (48), authorized action (action authorized by one with the performance-authority to authorize it), and the description of potestas as the power to perform an action "on account of being authorized to perform it" (51). Similarly, Chapter 5 takes up the nature of governance, and specifies the unique nature of political governance: public governance, or governance by the state of the public (58). It's a strange, sui generis kind of governance, one that we cannot opt out of so long as we find ourselves within the borders of the state: "The state's public governance of those within its territorial jurisdiction is ultimate" (59). The authority to govern, then, is to have the potestas (ability to perform an action on account of being authorized to do so) and the right to issue directives that are morally binding (62). An important feature of Wolterstorff's account of the authority to govern is that "a condition of having the potestas to issue a binding directive to someone to do something is that it be morally permissible to direct him to do that" (63).

This sets up a crucial step in Wolterstorff's argument: the distinction between performance-authority and positional authority. Positional authority is simply conferred upon the legitimate assumption of a position of authority within a governance-authority structure, and the occupant of such a position operates within the bounds of her positional authority when she issues directives within the jurisdiction proper to that position. Even while operating within her proper jurisdiction, however, she exceeds her performance-authority if she issues directives that she is morally obligated not to issue. In other words, there are moral constraints on the exercise of performance-authority; performance-authority is forfeited when those constraints are violated.

The most innovative part of the book is Wolterstorff's use of the above distinction to offer a rereading of Romans 13, the canonical text on the Christian's relationship to the state. Rather than counseling universal submission to civil authorities, Wolterstorff argues, Paul is counseling submission to civil authorities insofar as they are executing "the God-assigned task of government to curb injustice. . . . to protect the rights of the public" (90). Government clearly has the positional authority to issue whatever directives it deems appropriate to its citizens, but insofar as its directives violate justice or the rights of the public, government forfeits its performance-authority. The corollary is that "the directives that the government issues to the public for the purpose of curbing injustice are binding" (92).

Wolterstorff notes that the account of political authority "from above" that emerges from his rereading of Romans 13 bears a striking similarity to the account of political authority "from below" that he offers elsewhere (102).[3] In other words, the political authority of the state as the institution responsible for "protecting members of the public from being wronged by their fellows" can be derived both from natural rights, and from divine authority (103). Wolterstorff rightly recognizes that "God's political governance presupposes God's moral governance" (105), and notes that a full account of God's moral governance of humankind requires much more substantive treatment. His chapter on God's governance of humankind is quite slim, however, with only a brief nod to the many problems that follow from appeals to moral intuition.

Wolterstorff's account of the relation between God's authority and the state's authority is comprehensive and clear. His rereading of Romans 13, in particular, brings much-needed precision into the debate over the right relationship of the Christian to the state. While the general theoretical apparatus is sound, however, Wolterstorff only gestures at how to handle specific cases where the state oversteps its performance-authority. He mentions the possibility that the Christian might still be ultima facie obligated to obey, depending on prudential and consequentialist considerations (117). This introduces significant uncertainty into the appropriateness of civil disobedience. One can imagine a situation when civil disobedience might clearly be called for, but if the probability of changing the state's position were low enough (or the human cost high enough), Wolterstorff's position would seem to recommend against such acts. One wonders if the 1930 beatings of the Indian nationals at the Dharasana Salt Works, or the scalding coffee poured on 1960s civil rights protesters at New Orleans "whites only" lunch counters, would count as too high a price to pay, given the low probability of success.

The last four chapters deal with the second of the two dualities faced by the Christian as citizen: her position as a citizen of the state, and her membership in the institution of the church. Wolterstorff is quite insistent on the supreme kingship of Christ, and argues that the church's rejection of syncretism entails that it "either produces or increases religious fissure in every society in which it emerges" (122). An important corollary of this fact, however, is that when the church attempts to use coercion to prevent pluralism, it acts "contrary to its own nature" (123); in other words, the very nature of the church has implications for the kind of state the church should want. Given the fact of religious pluralism, the church ought to be opposed both to "pressure on citizens to join the church and participate in its activities [and to] . . . pressure on citizens not to do so" (126).

Wolterstorff's conclusion is that "the state is to grant institutional autonomy to the church and to all other counterpart religious institutions, and it is to grant religious freedom to all citizens" (131). Once again, we have an argument "from above" -- that the very nature of the church requires this conception of the state -- and "from below" -- one that appeals to principles of justice and natural rights.[4] What this means is that Christians have a vested interest in advocating for the moral rights of all religious institutions: "I may think your religion is wrong; but I will defend your civil right to be free to practice it" (144). Indeed, Wolterstorff asserts that all social "institutions with authority structures have moral rights against the state" (162).

This is perhaps the most interesting, and most puzzling, aspect of Wolterstorff's excellent book. Why think that any social institution with an authority structure places "normative limits . . . on the authority of the state" (171)? Wolterstorff's appeal is, as usual, to natural rights: we have a natural right to form social entities to accomplish goals without consulting the state; therefore, "the authority inherent within the entities that we establish then places limits on the authority of the state" (171). So it is now not only the rights of individuals, or the rights of religious institutions, but the rights of any institution with a governance-authority structure that limits the authority of the state. This goes a good way towards the increasingly popular argument that there is nothing special about religion, as against other claims of conscience: either all claims of conscience ought to be tolerated, or none ought to be tolerated.[5] The structure of Wolterstorff's argument -- and particularly, the sufficiency of the "argument from below" -- leads me to believe that he would accept this implication. A further question emerges, though: Do Christians now have a vested interest in advocating for the moral rights of all claims of conscience that arise from all institutions with a governance-authority structure? This seems a bridge too far.

The book is, in any case, a primer for anyone interested in a careful, methodical explanation of a specifically Christian political theory that provides a ground for liberal democracy. The cynic might well find it entirely too tidy that the form of government most consistent with Christian political obligations and the existence of the church just happens to be a liberal democracy. Wolterstorff's appeal to natural rights -- the "argument from below" -- should go some way towards addressing that worry, but the book's arguments will be most powerful for those already persuaded of Christianity who are looking for a political theory to make sense of their existing commitment. On that count, it succeeds.

[1] Kelly Sorensen’s NDPR review of Understanding Liberal Democracy (2013.09.06) has a substantive discussion of Wolterstorff’s criticisms of public reason liberalism, along with excellent replies.

[2] Resident Aliens (Nashville: Abingdon Press, 1989).

[3] "Accounting for the Political Authority of the State," in Understanding Liberal Democracy.

[4] Interestingly, Wolterstorff notes that the papal encyclical Dignitatis humanae (1965) makes an “argument from below” for religious freedom -- not exactly what one might expect! (131)

[5] In a similar vein, see Brian Leiter’s Why Tolerate Religion? (Princeton 2012), and for a historical perspective, see John Christian Laursen & María José Villaverde’s edited volume Paradoxes of Religious Toleration in Early Modern Thought (Princeton 2012).