The Minds of the Moderns: Rationalism, Empiricism, and Philosophy of Mind

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Janice Thomas, The Minds of the Moderns: Rationalism, Empiricism, and Philosophy of Mind, Acumen, 2009, 293pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773536388.

Reviewed by Stephen Puryear, North Carolina State University



In this work Thomas surveys the contributions of (pre-Kantian) early modern philosophy to our understanding of the mind. She focuses on the six canonical figures of the period — Descartes, Spinoza, Locke, Leibniz, Berkeley, and Hume — and asks what each has to say about five topics within the philosophy of mind. The topics are (1) the ontological status of mind, (2) the scope and nature of self-knowledge, (3) the nature of consciousness, (4) the problem of mental causation, and (5) the nature of representation or intentionality. The overarching aim of the book is to show that the theories articulated by these thinkers are not just historical curiosities, but have much to contribute to our understanding of these topics today.

In the chapters devoted to the ontological status of mind, Thomas aims “to trace the impact of the early modern period’s growing scepticism about substance on its evolving theories about the nature of mind” (4). Assuming there was such a growing skepticism, we might expect to find a definite shift during this period away from the view that minds are substances — indeed, immaterial substances — and toward the view that they are not substances at all. However, this is not what Thomas finds. On her view Locke is officially agnostic about whether the mind is a substance (though she muddies the water by claiming that for Locke “a person, mind or self is not a substance at all”, but rather “something that may be produced by, and certainly is supported and unified by, immaterial substance” 146). Further, Hume denies outright that the mind is a substance, since he considers it only a bundle of perceptions. But Berkeley, she says, agrees with Descartes and Leibniz that the mind is an immaterial substance, and Spinoza maintains that the human mind is not a substance but merely an idea in the mind of God. Hence, there is no straightforward progression from those who consider the mind to be a substance to those who don’t. The growing skepticism about substance, Thomas concludes, seems to have had no straightforward impact on early modern theories of mind.

Concerning self-knowledge, Thomas concentrates on two questions. First, what kind of knowledge, if any, can we have of the nature and existence of the mind or self? Second, what kind of knowledge, if any, can we have of the contents of the mind (i.e., perceptions, beliefs, intentions, etc.)? In brief, she finds that to some extent all the philosophers agree that we can have self-knowledge of both kinds. Leibniz, however, differs from the rest in that he alone holds that most of our mental contents lie beyond the reach of our awareness, and Locke, to his discredit, parts company with the others in denying that we ever have unconscious mental contents.

In the chapters devoted to the nature of consciousness, Thomas contends that Spinoza, Locke, and Hume offer few insights. Indeed she roundly criticizes Spinoza and Locke for deficiencies in their views. One problem with Spinoza’s theory, she says, is that he seems committed to denying that human minds are conscious subjects. For if God is the only substance, it’s hard to see how he could fail to be the only conscious subject (81-82). Moreover, she adds, if the divine mind is just a bundle of ideas, as Spinoza appears to hold, it’s hard to see how even God could be a conscious subject (Ibid.). Thomas objects to Locke’s view on the ground that his account of memory conflicts with his belief that we are always conscious of all our ideas (156-59).

On the positive side, Thomas sees Descartes and Leibniz as proposing accounts of the nature of consciousness — accounts that may be viewed as precursors of the sort of higher-order thought approaches that some advocate today. She also argues that many early modern philosophers recognize, even if only tacitly, different kinds of consciousness. For instance, on her reading Descartes, Leibniz, and Hume all distinguish at least implicitly between what contemporary philosophers would call “perceptual consciousness”, “access consciousness”, and “phenomenal consciousness”; and Descartes further distinguishes between “organism consciousness” and “introspective consciousness”. Thomas appears to be rather impressed by this point; however, I believe it rests on a faulty inference. In each case she starts with the banal observation that a philosopher recognizes consciousness of different kinds of things, and from this infers the substantive conclusion that he believes in different kinds of consciousness. This is clearly a non-sequitur. Consciousness of different kinds of things does not imply different kinds of consciousness, and in the absence of any explicit evidence that these philosophers drew such distinctions, we should not be so quick to suppose that they did.

One of the more familiar problems for early modern theories of mind concerns mental causation. It is well known that Descartes thinks the mind, an immaterial substance, can interact with the body, a material substance. Yet it’s notoriously difficult to see how such radically different types of substance could influence one another. Descartes hardly addresses this problem himself, but according to Thomas his best response would be to note that though we cannot understand in detail how such interaction works, theistic philosophers, at least, should not doubt that it is possible, since it is of a piece with the influence God exerts on matter when he sets it in motion. Locke, Thomas tells us, finds himself in a similar situation. He too claims that minds and bodies interact, but he offers even less than Descartes in the way of an explanation of how such interaction works.

Berkeley and Hume agree that minds and bodies interact, but for them this interaction is considerably less enigmatic. In Berkeley’s case, bodies are really just bundles of ideas. For him, then, mind-body interaction amounts to nothing more than an unproblematic interaction between a mind and its ideas. In Hume’s case, minds and bodies truly influence one another, but this influence is nothing more than constant conjunction; there’s no reason why the changes in two entities can’t be constantly conjoined, even if those entities have radically different natures. So for Hume mind-body interaction is no more or less troubling than body-body interaction, which nearly everyone considers legitimate.

In contrast to their fellow early modern philosophers, both Spinoza and Leibniz hold that in an important sense minds and bodies don’t truly interact. On Spinoza’s view, they do not interact because they are identical, it being impossible for something to interact with itself. Leibniz would agree with the critics who assert that since mind and body have such different natures, they cannot interact in any ordinary sense. He would add, however, that they appear to interact only because their changes are always coordinated, God having created them with precisely those natures that would guarantee their perpetual harmony with one another. Thomas takes note of Leibniz’s suggestion that minds and bodies interact “ideally”, insofar as they move God to accommodate the others to them in order to bring them into harmony. But she dismisses this suggestion because she thinks it would deprive God of the title of first cause, and because it would require backward causation, which is impossible. It would have been helpful at this point in the book to hear more about the views of Malebranche, but, alas, Thomas hardly mentions him at all, and she discusses occasionalism only briefly and in passing (see 128, 220-21).

The intentionality of a representation — its quality of representing or being about some object — is said to be derived if (and only if) it is parasitic on the intentionality of something else; otherwise it is said to be original. Thus, if I wanted to depict, say, the order in which the early modern philosophers were born, I might do so by arranging six arbitrarily-chosen objects on my desk and stipulating that the leftmost one represents Descartes, the next Spinoza, and so forth. In that case, the intentionality acquired by these objects would be derived, since they do not represent these philosophers in and of themselves but only insofar as I — a being whose thoughts represent these objects — confer that intentionality upon them. According to many philosophers, however, the intentionality of my thoughts is not like this: their representational contents are intrinsic to them, and so their intentionality is not derived but original.

In the chapters on representation, Thomas argues that of all the philosophers under consideration, only Hume would agree with those philosophers who hold that our ideas or thoughts have original intentionality. On his view, she argues, our ideas represent their objects mostly in virtue of being caused by, and to a lesser degree in virtue of resembling, those objects. Their intentionality is therefore not simply derived from the intentionality of other representations. The others, she holds, all agree that our ideas derive their intentionality ultimately from God (and, presumably, from the intentionality of God’s ideas). Most of them believe that God confers intentionality upon our ideas by, in effect, decreeing that a given idea represent a certain object, in much the same way that I confer intentionality upon the objects on my desk through stipulation. Thus in the case of the innate ideas of Descartes and Leibniz, or the sensory ideas of Berkeley, God simply stipulates what their representational content will be, and then, as it were, plants them in our minds. When it comes to Cartesian sensory ideas, or Lockean ideas in general, God bestows intentionality in less direct fashion, endowing us with physiological mechanisms specifically designed to produce the appropriate representations within us. Of course, Spinoza would not say that God does anything by decree, but on Thomas’ reading even he holds that our ideas in some way derive their representational character from the original intentionality of God.

These conclusions about intentionality appear to me to be wholly unfounded. As far as I can tell most of the philosophers under consideration have virtually nothing to say about how our ideas represent. Thomas obviously disagrees, but this is because she sees evidence of accounts of intentionality where there is none. In several places she reasons that because a philosopher believes that our ideas ultimately originate with God, the intentionality of these ideas must be derived: that is, they must represent their objects not in virtue of their intrinsic qualities, but only in virtue of having been selected by God to represent those objects. Thus, she has this to say about Descartes’ innate ideas: “These ideas are placed in their possessor by God and thus owe their ‘aboutness’ or intentionality to God. Despite appearances, these ideas thus have intentionality that is derived, rather than original” (53). But this is a mistake. Of course in one sense it’s quite true that on Descartes’ view these ideas owe their intentionality to God. As modifications of created substances, they owe their very being to God, and that which has no being cannot represent. Contrary to what Thomas suggests, however, this does not suffice to make their intentionality derived. Even if our ideas are created by God, it might be essential to them to represent the particular objects they represent, and in that case their intentionality would be original, not derived, even though in a sense they would owe their intentionality to God.

It seems a particularly egregious mistake to interpret Leibniz along these lines. Among other reasons, he repeatedly distances himself from those who would say that God arbitrarily imposes intentionality upon our ideas. As he writes in the New Essays on Human Understanding,

We must not suppose that these ideas, such as those of color or pain, are arbitrary and without relation or natural connection with their causes: it is not God’s way to act with so little order and reason. I would say rather that there is a kind of resemblance, though not one that is entire and, so to speak, in terminus, but one that is expressive [i.e., representational] and involves a relation of order.1

This passage and others like it suggest that on Leibniz’s view our ideas express or represent their objects in and of themselves, in virtue of a natural relation or resemblance which obtains between them, and not simply because God imposes these contents upon them. But this would make their intentionality original, not derived.

Thomas herself calls attention to passages in which Leibniz appears to indicate that representation (often?) involves a kind of structural correspondence or isomorphism between representation and thing represented (135). But she quickly rebuffs the suggestion that on Leibniz’s view our ideas or perceptions represent in this way. As she sees it, only things with parts or elements could be isomorphic to one another, and monads, as utterly simple substances, have neither (136). This, however, is too quick. Monads may have neither parts nor elements, but they do have modifications, and Leibniz quite clearly believes that these modifications can form structures, larger perceptions being composed in some way out of smaller ones. He is even prepared to speak of these smaller perceptions as “parts” of the larger ones.2 Not only does Thomas ascribe to the early moderns accounts of intentionality for which there is scant evidence, then, but in at least one case she fails to ascribe to a philosopher an account that he clearly did propose.

Despite these shortcomings, my overall impression of Thomas’ book is rather favorable. She displays a good understanding of a wide range of philosophers, including some, such as Spinoza and Leibniz, who are rather difficult. Further, not satisfied with merely explaining what these philosophers thought, she devotes significant portions of the book to defending them against objections and taking them to task for their shortcomings. Notwithstanding a few notable exceptions, these criticisms and defenses struck me as quite cogent. Finally, in keeping with her goal of showing that the early modern philosophers have much to offer us today, Thomas frequently calls the reader’s attention to connections between the views of these earlier philosophers and more recent work in the philosophy of mind. For example, she helpfully compares Spinoza’s identity theory with Davidson’s anomalous monism, and she considers the extent to which the “physical exclusion problem” discussed in the recent literature resembles the problem of mind-body interaction that has traditionally been thought to undermine Descartes’ view (69, 48f.). For all these reasons, Thomas’ book should be a welcome addition to the literature in this important but underexplored area. It should prove valuable not only to students of early modern philosophy but also to historians of philosophy more generally, as well as to contemporary philosophers of mind who seek a better understanding of the historical roots of their subject.

1 Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1923), 6.6:131.

2 Ibid. 56.