The Mirror of the World: Subjects, Consciousness, and Self-Consciousness

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Christopher Peacocke, The Mirror of the World: Subjects, Consciousness, and Self-Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2014, 283pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199699568.

Reviewed by Barry Dainton, University of Liverpool


Provided there is suitable illumination a mirror will more or less accurately reflect its environment: the light reflecting from its surface will represent its surroundings. In doing so, the mirror will -- typically -- not represent itself. However, under certain circumstances a mirror can do so: all you need do is hold another mirror in front of it. According to the account of subjects Christopher Peacocke elaborates over the course of his book, subjects are analogous. Their conscious states will normally represent their surroundings, but in doing so will often not represent themselves. However, some subjects do have the ability to represent themselves, and different subjects can do so in different ways.

Peacocke's account of subjects is in many ways an appealing one (or at least I found it so), but also complex and multi-layered. In the most fundamental move made in the book, he takes subjects and their experiences to be ontologically basic, but also interdependent. This interdependency is a consequence of two interrelated metaphysical theses. The first is that "what makes something a conscious state or event is that there is something it is like for the subject of that state or event to be in that state, or to be the subject of that event." (40) The second principle is that "what makes something a conscious subject is that it is capable of being in conscious states and of being the subject of conscious events." (41) Subjects and experiences are thus correlative: it is impossible for one to exist without the other.

Peacocke suggests that this conception of what a subject is may well be in agreement with Sartre's claim in Transcendence of the Ego that consciousness is the subject's 'dimension of being'. (Quite how his views compare with Sartre's is a recurrent theme in the book.) But he also insists that it would be wrong to take this conception to be fully Cartesian as well. It is perfectly possible to hold that subjects and experiences are ontologically interdependent while also holding -- as Peacocke does -- that consciousness is materially realized.

There is a second divergence from Descartes, which Peacocke does not dwell on, but which is also important for the overall plausibility of his position. By virtue of being essentially conscious it is impossible for a Cartesian subject to lose consciousness and remain in existence. By virtue of being only potentially conscious a Peacockian subject needn't always be conscious; it will continue to exist even when unconscious provided it retains the capacity for consciousness.

All subjects may have the capacity for consciousness in common, but for Peacocke not all subjects are capable of having the same kind of consciousness: there are different "degrees of self-representation", which are described in the opening chapter. Consider first a race of primitive sea-dwelling creatures that (we can suppose) enjoy only a very rudimentary form of consciousness: they are capable of observing edible items in their immediate surroundings, and moving towards them with a view to eating them. These simple subjects are incapable of representing themselves in any way at all -- they have eyes only for their food. In Peacocke's terms, subjects such as these are Degree 0 subjects. We humans are very different: we are capable of fully conceptual thought and experience, and so (typically) we can self-represent and think of ourselves using the personal pronoun. Conscious beings with these advanced capabilities are Degree 3 subjects. In between, occupying the Degree 2 position, are subjects who are capable of genuine self-representation, but only in a non-conceptual way: in Peacocke's terms, they are capable of i-thoughts, but not I-thoughts. A subject can only have conceptual experiences if it is capable of employing its representations in reasoning and judgment. Although subjects at Degree 2 represent themselves, they are unable to do so conceptually since they lack the reasoning abilities that are a pre-condition of concept use.

Like other kinds of content, the non-conceptual contents to be found in Degree 2 subjects have correctness conditions. In the case of mental states and events featuring the non-conceptual i, the correctness condition is "intrinsically subject-referring", i.e., they are a type of content "whose instances refer de jure, without any use of descriptive elements, to the subject of the mental event in question." (9). The fact that de se contents and states can be both conceptual and non-conceptual has the consequence that we may be more similar to non-human subjects than has sometimes been thought, or so Peacocke argues:

The difference between the mental lives of a squirrel, an octopus and a human does not prevent them from sharing literally the same type of de se content. What is common across the contents of the mental events of those very different creatures, when those events each have a de se content, is that each such content has a correctness condition that constitutively and fundamentally concerns the subject of the event in question. (14)

With these foundations in place, Peacocke goes on to say something, in chapter III, about the metaphysics of subjects -- I'll be saying more about this shortly. He then sets about demonstrating the benefits that flow from adopting the stances he recommends to subjects, experience and the de se.

The topic of chapter IV is the first person concept. Peacocke argues that a number of considerations all point to "I" and its cognates being grounded in the more basic nonconceptual counterpart i. In chapter V we turn to various first person phenomena, and discover why Peacocke's de se explanation is superior to the rivals. In chapter VI we turn to Descartes' cogito. Here Peacocke argues (persuasively) that if we adopt his view of subjects, then Descartes was right -- in a limited sense, at any rate -- to think he was entitled to move from a particular conscious thinking is going on, to I am thinking, and then to I exist. In chapter VII we turn to Kant's treatment of rational psychology and "The Paralogisms of Pure Reason". Over the course of an exceptionally clear discussion of this notoriously difficult material, Peacocke argues that while some of Kant's main conclusions were correct, many of the arguments he employed to reach them were flawed.

The final three chapters of the book are no less interesting. Here Peacocke seeks to delineate three important forms of self-consciousness, forms that are available to more subjects whose cognitive capabilities go beyond those required for possession of the first person concept, in its conceptual and non-conceptual guises. Here, as elsewhere, his discussion is sophisticated and nuanced, and connections are drawn with other philosophical treatments of the topic and relevant empirical findings.

Taken as a whole the book is an impressive piece of work, and it provides a valuable introduction to the stance Peacocke adopts on a wide range of issues. The book is based on a text used for lectures, and in revising the text Peacocke says that he "aimed to preserve the concise and direct style appropriate for a lecture." Since for the most part he succeeded, Mirror would serve as an excellent introduction for those coming to Peacocke's writings for the first time.

Although much of what Peacocke has to say on the nature of subjects struck me as very plausible, I did have a couple of concerns. For a book that is about subjects of experience, surprisingly little space is devoted to elucidating precisely what subjects are. The third chapter, "The Metaphysics of Conscious Subjects," is devoted to this topic, and it does provide answers to a number of questions. But even here Peacocke is disappointingly reticent on some central issues.

Peacocke tells us at the outset that subjects are things that are capable of having experiences, and that they are ontologically interdependent with experiences. He also tells us that subjects typically persist through time, and some conscious states are experienced as states that exist continuously. Importantly, he also holds that we have every reason to think that the mental states and capacities that subjects possess are materially grounded. More specifically, a subject's mental capacities are located in an "integrating apparatus", and the latter plays an essential role in subject's persistence through time:

the identity of a subject over time consists in the identity of the apparatus that integrates states and events in such a way that a single subject has, or may have, perceptions, sensations, thoughts, action-awareness, and the rest, both at a time and over time. . . . [a] subject x is identical with a subject y if and only if x and y have the same material integrating apparatus. (65-66)

Although the identity of a subject is tightly bound to an integrating apparatus, Peacocke insists that it would be a mistake to think that subjects are numerically identical with integrating systems. Having an integrating system is one thing, being an integrating system is quite another. Subjects and integrating systems can't be one and the same because integrating systems -- although they possess the same range of mental capacities as subjects -- have properties that subjects lack. An integrating apparatus might "be concentrated in a certain set of regions [the subject's] brain. The subject is not concentrated in a certain set of regions in his brain; and similarly for a range of other properties possessed by the integrating apparatus, but not by the subject." (66)

While this is a promising start, it does of course give rise to further questions. What are the other properties that integrating systems possess but which subjects lack? If integrating systems are "concentrated" in brains, but subjects aren't, just what is the relationship between a subject and its brain, and its body? Are subjects evenly distributed throughout our bodies? Or is it a mistake to think of them as spatially located at all? Since Peacocke declines to elaborate further, we simply don't know what his answers to these important questions might be.[1]

One thing Peacocke does make clear is that by virtue of being so intimately related to integrating systems subjects themselves have the same general kind of persistence conditions as ordinary material objects. A complex physical thing, such as a car or a ship, can persist through time despite undergoing changes in its constituent parts. If over a period of a decade, repeated trips to the garage have meant that all your car's parts have changed, provided the changes occur sufficiently gradually, and each of the new parts is fitted in the right way, you still have the car you started with, despite the total change in material constituents. In an analogous fashion, suggests Peacocke, your integrating system can change its parts, provided it does so only gradually:

Your perceptual apparatus may be entirely replaced consistently with your continued existence, provided that the states produced by the new apparatus are properly integrated by some continuing apparatus with your other conscious states and events. Like any other material object, the matter constituting the integrating apparatus may also change over time. (66)

Is Peacocke right to think that subjects of experience have the same persistence conditions as integrating systems or cars? To appreciate why this claim might be problematic it suffices to contemplate a spectrum of cases involving different rates of part-replacement. At one end of the spectrum we have a brain all of whose parts get changed in a gradual fashion -- atom by atom, neuron by neuron -- over a period of five years. At the other end of the spectrum we have a brain all of whose parts are all replaced very rapidly indeed: near-instantaneously. This could be brought about by very advanced neuro-surgery, or by a quantum-mechanical fluke. In between these two extremes there are a large number of intermediate cases, where the part-replacement happens more or less quickly. Importantly, we will assume that in each of the cases in this spectrum (a) the mental lives that are produced by the physical systems in question are subjectively exactly the same, and (b) that during their waking hours the subjects involved enjoy streams of consciousness that are every bit as unified and continuous as the stream you have been enjoying since you last woke up.

If Peacocke is correct, and subjects do have the same persistence conditions as an ordinary compound material object, then somewhere along this spectrum of cases, the part-replacement is inevitably going to be fatal to the original subject. There will no doubt be difficult-to-interpret borderline cases, but there will also be many cases that are entirely unambiguous. If the part-replacement is carried out fairly gradually over a couple of days or weeks, there is no problem: the integrating system survives (much as a car or ship would), and so the subject also survives. But if the replacement is carried out over a period of half a second, we have -- in effect -- completely annihilated the original integrating system (in the form of a human brain), and replaced it with an exact duplicate. In this case, the subject most definitely does not survive -- or at least, not if the identity and existence of subjects is tied to particular integrating systems. Peacocke is prepared to bite the bullet. He concedes that in such extreme cases the post-replacement subjects would believe they are identical with the pre-replacement subject, but they are mistaken:

[such cases] involve an illusion of identity over time on the part of the subjects in the later parts of the series. If two experiences are not realized in the same integrating apparatus, they are not experiences of the same subject. So apparent identity (even by reliable causes) by no means ensures genuine identity on the present view. (68)

I, for one, find this interpretation of the scenario in question implausible. If my own brain were to suffer the envisaged part-substitutions, given that in all the cases along the spectrum the continuity of my conscious mental life -- or at least, the consciousness being produced by the physical systems in question -- would be entirely unperturbed, I find it very difficult to believe that in some of these cases I would survive, but in others I would cease to exist. The reason for this is simple and straightforward: the notion that my current stream could continue to flow on but fail to take me with it seems absurd, irrespective of what physical alterations may be taking place inside my skull.

I also find it hard to believe I am alone in regarding these matters thus. Just think of what the "continuity" of a typical stretch of a your ordinary streams of consciousness involves. As they unfold, our conscious mental lives are not stroboscopic, constantly stopping and starting; they are profoundly continuous, with each brief phase (itself dynamic in character) seguing seamlessly into the next. Think of what it is like to watch a candle flickering, or smoke rising after the candle is extinguished; think of what it is like to hear a sequence of notes in a melody unfolding -- or to feel the throbbing of a headache. Isn't an uninterrupted conscious flow of this sort sufficient in itself to ensure that one remains in existence, regardless of what alterations take place in the underlying physical machinery that produces it? It seems very plausible to thinks so. Conscious states and events that are experienced as unfolding in a continuous fashion are manifestly constituents of the mental life of a single conscious subject. We know this because (a) we are conscious subjects, and (b) our conscious mental lives take precisely this form.

It is revealing in this connection to consider a synchronic analogue of the cases we have just been considering. Peacocke takes a very firm stance on the unity of consciousness at a time. He holds that the nature of subjects is such that their consciousness is necessarily fully unified at any given moment, i.e., the contents of their consciousness will all be experienced together (or be mutually co-conscious).[2] Let us suppose that in the future it becomes possible to divide an integrating apparatus into two spatially separated parts, and that this separation does not affect the kinds of experiences the parts can jointly produce. (We can suppose -- without dwelling on the details -- that the separated halves send signals to one another via radio transceivers.) Despite having parts that are spatially separated, the integrating apparatus in question still produces fully unified states of consciousness whenever it is active. Will the spatially scattered system still manage to sustain the existence of a single subject of consciousness? If, as Peacocke holds, it is impossible for there to be an experience in the absence of a subject, and a fully unified conscious state necessarily belongs to a single subject, there is only one way of interpreting this scenario. Since the dis-integrated integrating system is producing a single state of consciousness, we must view it as sustaining one subject, a subject whose unified consciousness is jointly sustained by two discrete physical things.

A serious-looking tension in Peacocke's overall position on subject-identity has now emerged. In the synchronic case, a system will count as a single integrating apparatus provided it is capable of producing a single unified conscious state, irrespective of other considerations -- such as the spatial proximity of its constituent parts. There is no possibility of there existing a fully unified conscious state, a state that appears for all the world to belong to a single subject, but where this appearance turns out to be illusory. In the diachronic case, however, deviant behaviour does matter: if an integrating apparatus changes its parts too quickly, it ceases to sustain a subject in existence, even though it manages to produce a fully continuous stream of consciousness throughout. Although this stream of consciousness has all the appearances of being an extended episode in the conscious life of a single subject, this appearance is illusory, or so we are being asked to believe. In the synchronic case Peacocke is happy to grant primacy to purely experiential factors. If a collection of experiences e1, e2 and e3 exist simultaneously in a unified state of awareness, then necessarily these experiences belong to a single subject, irrespective of how these experiences are being produced. This is a very plausible stance to adopt; it is difficult to see that the experiences in a unified state of consciousness could fail to belong to a single subject. But isn't it equally obvious that the same can and does apply diachronically? If e1, e2 and e3 are experienced as a succession, as parts of a continuous stream of consciousness, for the reasons outlined earlier, it seems as clear as can be that these experiences must also belong to a single subject of experience.

Given this, the best way to resolve the tension is obvious. Why not treat the diachronic case in the same way as the synchronic, and say that an object, or collection of objects, that is able to produce a single unified stream of consciousness sustains a single subject in existence, irrespective of any changes in material parts it undergoes? By not binding subjects to any single material objects we end up with a more plausible general account of the kind that subjects are. If, as seems plausible, a subject is something whose nature is such that when awake it enjoys unified states and streams of consciousness, then the existence of a continuous stream of consciousness entails the existence of a single subject. There is no longer any possibility of a stream of consciousness existing and its seeming to belong to a single subject, but its not really doing so.

This issue aside, as should by now be clear, I found much to like and admire in Peacocke's treatment of subjects. Taking subjects to be things that have the capacity to be conscious is an appealing alternative to the Cartesian view of them. His claim that subjects can come in many shapes and sizes (as well as species), and have very different levels of cognitive sophistication, is also a very plausible one. However, I did wonder whether he went far enough in this direction.

The most primitive subjects that Peacocke (here at least) is prepared to countenance are those capable of "Degree 0" self-representations. Subjects of this kind are able to perceive their surroundings, but they do so without representing themselves in any way. That there may well be such subjects -- vast numbers of them -- I would not want to question. But might there not be more primitive subjects still? Might there not be subjects whose experience does not represent their environment in any way whatsoever? Perhaps Peacocke's primitive sea-dwellers, when first born, are capable of rudimentary forms of experience, but -- since their nervous systems are still under development -- this experience does not accurately represent their surroundings. It consists of nothing more than random swirls of colour (and perhaps sound, or bodily feelings). Peacocke does not acknowledge the possibility of subjects whose experience is this simple in character, but neither does he offer any arguments as to why such subjects cannot exist. Since I know of no (good) arguments to this effect, I, for one, am reluctant to rule their possibility out.

If we do admit the possibility of very primitive subjects, there is a consequence that Peacocke in particular might well find uncongenial. Since the subjects in question are incapable of perceiving (or representing) their environments, these subjects at least are not remotely mirror-like in nature. They are more akin to fire-flies or glow-worms or tiny fluorescent fish -- small glimmers of light (experience) amid the surrounding darkness. The resulting picture lacks the elegant simplicity of Peacocke's -- there will no longer be a single analogy that is capable of reflecting the nature of subjects of all kinds. But it may well be more realistic.

[1] The fact that Peacocke himself says that he is providing only a "partial account" (66) of the identity conditions of subjects suggests that he is aware that on some issues there is more to be said.

[2] Contents are co-conscious when experienced together.  Peacocke argues that co-consciousness is necessarily transitive: there can’t possibly be a conscious state featuring experiences e1, e2 and e3, where e1 is co-conscious with e2, and e2 is co-conscious with e3, but e1 and e3 are not co-conscious.