The Misguided Search for the Political: Social Weightlessness in Radical Democratic Theory

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Lois McNay, The Misguided Search for the Political: Social Weightlessness in Radical Democratic Theory, Polity, 2014, 250pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745662633.

Reviewed by Max Pensky, Binghamton University


Lois McNay's book is a broadside against the ontological turn in recent political theory. This is the current of political thought based on the assertion of an ontologically significant hiatus between the realm of "the political" (as distinct from politics) and that of mundane social existence, and the corresponding view that the realm of political agency is, or at least ought to be, one of radical indeterminacy, agonism, plurality, or contingency (or abundance, or flux, or difference, or generosity, or becoming, or one of another several dozen more or less cognate terms). By contrast, the social is, variously, the realm of convention, inauthenticity, mere existence as opposed to agency, the "blob," in Hannah Pitkin's memorable phrase referring to Arendt, threatening to pull political actors back into the mass-democratic humdrum.

The authors McNay collects under the rubric of radical democratic theory -- Chantal Mouffe, Jacques Rancière, William Connolly, James Tully, and Wendy Brown, to name the most prominent -- are of course very differently motivated and differently situated theorists in many important senses. However, for McNay, a distinctive form of abstraction -- 'weightlessness' -- is characteristic of all of their political theories. This is not the familiar, primarily methodologically motivated abstraction familiar from Rawlsian ideal theory, or Habermasian discourse theory. Instead, it's an ontological commitment with deep (and deeply unfortunate) methodological consequences.

The ontological distinction between the open, agonistic, under-determined, contingent sphere of "the political" as the scene of human freedom, and the social as the sphere of necessity, domination, and subordination tempts radical democratic theorists, in one way or another, into social weightlessness, a term McNay borrows from Pierre Bourdieu. As the sphere beyond the encumbrances of material social existence, "the political" can only function as a source of critical theory regarding the bases of unfreedom and domination for as long as theory maintains its inability or unwillingness to take seriously the reality of social suffering. Suffering is quarantined and forgotten -- a feature that Adorno had already observed, over a half century ago, as diagnostic of a form of thinking that manages to turn the foundations -- the moral purpose -- of critical thinking upside down.

The weightlessness of the political is thus something of a first principle for the radical democrats McNay reads. It's an axiom generating a global, principled incuriosity about the nature and facts of social suffering. McNay sees this principled incuriosity as the reverse side of the celebration of the political as sphere of radical freedom. Hence the ontological divide as foundational for critical social theory leads to intractable problems, which vary from theorist to theorist, but all bear a strong family resemblance. The incuriosity about social existence in general, and social suffering in particular, is part and parcel of a persistent overestimation of the prospects for marginalized and disadvantaged groups to realize their political agency. Conversely, the vision of the political as a realm of radical contingency, plenitude, and possibility radically underestimates the various ways in which power operates to replicate inequality and domination.

This structural misestimation can occasionally rise to a sort of victim-blaming (though McNay herself never describes it in this way). There is a narrow space separating contempt for the indignities of social existence with contempt for those who seem unable to depart for the giddy open spaces of political contingency and radical agency.

This less-than-pleasant undercurrent, subtle yet palpable, in agonist political theory surely traces back in large measure to the very specific historical and intellectual constellation from which radical democratic theory has always drawn its inspiration and substance. Schmitt, Strauss, Heidegger and Arendt were certainly not the first political philosophers to recoil from the prospect of mass society and its threat to a vivid, classically inspired vision of the performance of political freedom.

But all of them (Arendt included) translated that deep revulsion at the looming prospect of mass society into a historically distinct mode of political conservatism associating political agency with a special (and sometimes subterranean) cache of value, the possibility of a grandeur, and a nobility of soul, only possible by action in the open space of political life. The distaste for social existence is part of this conservatism. One of the sharper ironies of the intellectual history of the past decades is the return of this most durable and mutable strain of political theory as a source of new life and impetus for the radical-left project of a critique of power and domination once the force of Marxist critique seemed spent.

In the first chapter, "Suffering and Social Weightlessness," McNay draws on the work of Bourdieu and Axel Honneth to present a conception of social suffering, whose inability to register theoretically is the common thread in the thinkers she analyzes. Both are motivated by the common concern that critical theory has lost its capacity to register and address endemic material suffering with its origins in structures of social domination and inegalitarian institutions. Both recognize a need for drastic methodological innovation to find ways to recapture that capacity. Bourdieu's conception of the habitus, the petites miseres of daily, inconspicuous, capillary-fine social injustice, and Honneth's theory of mal-recognition as the driver of social pathologies, focus on a suite of psychic, corporal, and emotional states traceable back to changeable social institutions and practices.

Social suffering has an irreducible, material physical core, but to ignore its social content is to miss a great deal of what any normative social theory ought to be most curious about. Deprive people of access to healthy, affordable food, and they will (likely) become both obese and malnourished; offer them nothing but repetitive drudgery as paid labor, and they will become bored and sick; deprive them of decent education and access to their own culture, and they will find themselves unable to derive satisfaction or relief from it. Deprive people of the chance to do something about suffering through their own efforts and they will become frustrated and angry, and will turn this frustration and anger upon themselves. Pain and frustration, boredom and anger make people miserable. Misery makes people hopeless. Hopelessness deepens suffering and renders alternatives invisible.

McNay's introductory chapter (which I've roughly summarized above) traces this logic while laying the foundations for a "disclosive" form of critical social theory as an alternative to the social weightlessness of radical democratic theory. Chapter 2, "The Unbearable Lightness of Theory," reads Chantal Mouffe's well-known theory of political agonism as the paradigmatic case of socially weightless critique. The 'primacy of the political' in Mouffe's work, for McNay, demands an ontological divide in which social existence necessarily vanishes as an object of critical attention. The anti-essentialism of Mouffe's vision of agonal politics commits her to a kind of celebration of the political, as the privileged realm in which alone agency is possible. Agency, in turn, is consistently to be thought in terms of self-creation. And the passionate agency of individual and collective self-creation is ultimately the model for radical democratic politics, in which oppressed and marginalized groups contest the terms of their exclusion by radically re-imagining, challenging, and re-forming the terms of their political identity.

Which all sounds fine, I suppose, unless those oppressed and marginalized people weren't feeling quite so exhausted, footsore, frustrated, and depressed. Here of course McNay confronts a difficult but persistent antinomy, which her study generally approaches with tact and insight. On the one hand, there is something undeniably wrong, both descriptively and normatively, with a political theory of radical democracy so willfully blind to the nature and depth of social suffering that it fails to register how it might simply not be plausible to claim one's political agency, as if one could simply step out of one's entrapment in a vicious circle of social suffering like leaving a bad restaurant. This kind of insensitivity is tantamount to an additional burden on the poor, who are now, at least implicitly, blameworthy for not stepping into the rarified arena of political agonism. Abstraction is a choice -- and a wrong choice politically. On the other hand, there is an opposite and complementary kind of mistake in thinking of poverty and social misery as inevitably connected in every circumstance, which threatens to evaporate the normative purpose of critical social theory and turn it into little more than a catalogue of misfortune. While Mouffe's abstractions badly overestimate the real capacities of oppressed and dominated people to become political agents, there is a complementary underestimation of the possibility of any agency at all. Disclosive critique à la Honneth is meant to situate itself in the space between these alternatives.

McNay's third chapter turns to contemporary feminist theorists, concentrating on the work of Wendy Brown and Linda Zerilli, challenging what they view as the defeatist assumptions that have driven much of feminist theory's preoccupation with identity politics, and who by contrast call for a form of feminist theorizing beyond determinate conceptions of subjectivity altogether. While sympathetic to many their claims, McNay argues that the embrace of indeterminacy, of a freedom of self-creativity beyond identity politics -- that is, of social weightlessness -- turns out once again to be self-undermining, even conceptually incoherent, insofar as any conceptual formation that would refer to women's determinate identities, their oppression, marginalization, and social exclusion, appears as a theoretical dead-end. McNay urges instead a relational, materialistic reconfiguration, rather than ecstatic abandonment, of concepts of women's identity and subjectivity.

In the fourth chapter, McNay analyzes what is surely one extreme pole of the ontological trend she diagnoses through the book: the political theory of Jacques Rancière. As McNay notes, this is in many respects an odd choice, since Rancière, notoriously, has no interest in prescriptive or normative political theory in any conventional sense; to the extent that "the political" can be related to a determinate concept at all, it is a wholly contingent and ephemeral event or rupture or discontinuity, an outbreak of negativity without any determinate content. To the extent, however, that Rancière has tried in various ways to associate that potential for disruption with the interests of the global poor, McNay notes, he nevertheless remains committed to the prospect of illuminating in some perspicuous manner the way human political agency is propelled by -- and occasionally, momentarily discloses -- the profoundly destabilizing capacity for equality. In this sense, McNay reads Rancière as a sort of ultimate case of the grand experiment in socially weightless political theorizing: rare, non-conceptual, and ultimately deeply mysterious, politics "happens," if at all, in ways and with effects entirely beyond the sedimented, hierarchical order of social existence, through the agency of the oppressed but ultimately beyond their conscious control. Politics, so understood, no longer requires -- or even stands in any determinable relation to -- the agency of the poor, or indeed the agency of anyone else.

The fifth chapter, on materialist political theories of "plenitude", or abundance, and pluralism in the work of William Connolly and James Tully, continues these themes by insisting that these tropes, attractive as they may be as part of a radical alternative to familiar alternatives in political theory, are ultimately without real normative purchase. Pluralization is gradually reduced to a largely aesthetic category without any clear application to the actual lives of actually existing persons: "The one-sided focus on pluralization, disequilibrium and seemingly limitless becoming occludes the recognition of persistent structural dynamics of power, leaving [Connolly] with an underdeveloped sense of the entrenched nature of certain inequalities and types of social misery." (188)

In a concluding chapter McNay summarizes her lengthy argument. The search for the weightless "political" is misguided insofar as it will predictably undermine -- enter into increasingly open conflict with -- the norms of freedom and equality that still, mutatis mutandis, continue to inform and motivate radical political theory. The "unvindicated privileging of political over social life, a valorization of impersonal dynamics over experiential ones and the construal of radical agency as an empty process of flux and contestation rather than as embodied practices in the world" together cause the very problems of powerlessness, inequality, and domination to emerge only as "secondary, merely empirical issues or, worse, drop out of the picture altogether." (208)

The 'disclosing critique' that McNay calls for to correct this outcome will reclaim for critical social theory a kind of phenomenological access to negative social experiences, with the practical aim of unmasking as socially constituted forms of suffering that otherwise "symbolic forms are used to naturalize and legitimate exploitive and unequal social relations and, above all, to manufacture political quiescence." (209)

Since I am in substantial agreement with most of McNay's position in this powerful, elegant and lucid book, I will limit my concluding critical comments to a single point.

Perhaps inevitably the category of "disclosive" critique remains significantly under-developed, and largely serves as a kind of promissory note. It's worth remembering, as I mentioned earlier, that disclosure as a critical concept has a strange family history in the tangled relations between Frankfurt School-inspired critical social theory and the conservative Heideggerianism that it largely defined itself against. Heideggerian Welterschliessung and unmasking critique surely have multiple affinities, as a number of commentators (most notably Nikolas Kompridis in recent work) have noted. But disclosure is not a critical concept independent of the sources of normativity, either tacitly or explicitly affirmed, in whose name disclosure of otherwise occluded forms of experience is disclosure of domination and oppression. Naming those sources -- critical theory's traditional Achilles heel -- risks uninteresting circularity absent some substantive commitments. Whether in the form of Rawls's "moral powers" or Habermas's deliberative super-norm, those commitments link forms of socially embodied rationality with the status of human beings as legitimate sources of moral claims. In Honneth's case, negative social experiences could never be disclosed as negative, that is, as pathologies, without deriving its backing from a fully developed theory of recognition that connects the phenomenology of suffering to an abstract Hegelian theory of social freedom. Absent some such substantive normative commitment, disclosive critique as a plausible alternative to weightless political theory risks merely adding weight back as a way of addressing the manifest shortcomings of abstraction. McNay still owes us a developed view of what this commitment will be, and given her impressive capacity as a critical reader, we should look forward to it.