The Modal Future: A Theory of Future-Directed Thought and Talk

The Modal Future A Theory Of Future Directed Thought And Talk

Fabrizio Cariani, The Modal Future: A Theory of Future-Directed Thought and Talk, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 292pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108474771.

Reviewed by Malte Willer, University of Chicago


The question of how to interpret statements about the future has been a recurrent theme in the philosophical literature ever since Aristotle’s discussion of future contingents in De Interpretatione. Of critical importance here—at least as far as the more recent literature is concerned—is how we should think about the semantic contribution of future auxiliaries such as the English ‘will’ and ‘going to’: are they best understood as temporal operators (such as the English ‘did’) or do they rather function like modal auxiliaries such as the English ‘might’ and ‘must’? Fabrizio Cariani’s book is a sophisticated plea for the modal future hypothesis, which sorts talk about the future as modal talk.[1] Its first three parts offer a detailed modal semantic analysis of future talk; the final two parts address key questions about the pragmatics of future assertions as well as themes pertaining to future cognition and epistemology.

A natural view is that past and future auxiliaries are ‘symmetric’ in the sense that just as the former are devices for talking about points in time in the past, the latter are devices for talking about points in time in the future: for instance, ‘Mary danced’ and ‘Mary will dance’ both posit the existence of some dancing event; their difference boils down to the temporal orientation of that event, relative to the time of utterance. This symmetry thesis can take various sophisticated shapes and forms but, according to Cariani, misses a critical asymmetry between past and future auxiliaries: the latter, but not the former, pattern with modal expressions in critical respects. Cariani relies here on a set of empirical observations from the linguistics literature (Chapter 3).[2] Peter Klecha (2014) notes, for instance, that the English predictive ‘will’ gives rise to the phenomenon of modal subordination:

(1) (a) If Katie travels to Chicago, she’ll visit Powell’s Books. (b) She’ll buy a bunch of used books.

We read (1b) as saying that Katie will buy many used books, assuming she travels to Chicago: the second sentence receives a conditional interpretation, just as the conditional consequent does. In that respect, ‘will’ behaves like a classical modal such as ‘might’:

(2) (a) If Katie travels to Chicago, she might visit Powell’s Books. (b) She might buy a bunch of used books.

(2b) is naturally read as articulating a conditional possibility: Katie might buy a bunch of used books, assuming she goes to Chicago.

In contrast, simple past tense does not seem to license modal subordination:

(3) (a) If Katie traveled to Chicago, she visited Powell’s Books. (b) ?? She bought a bunch of used books.

(3b) appears ill formed; at best it allows for an unconditional reading on which Katie bought a bunch of used books, regardless of whether she traveled to Chicago.

Another observation, again due to Klecha (2014), is that ‘will’ patterns with modals in obviating acquaintance inferences. The starting observation is that bare applications of predicates of personal taste such as ‘tasty’ and ‘fun’ present the speaker as having first-hand knowledge of the item or event under consideration, as highlighted by the oddness of (4). Use of past tense preserves this effect (cf. (5)).

(4) ?? I haven’t watched that movie, but it’s hilarious.

(5) ?? I didn’t watch that movie, but it was hilarious.

Modals such as ‘might’ and ‘must’ obviate the acquaintance inference. So—and this is the critical observation—does ‘will’:

(6) I haven’t watched that movie, but it might/must be hilarious.

(7) I haven’t watched that movie, but it’ll be hilarious.

Once again ‘will’ patterns with canonical modal expressions and contrasts with canonical temporal operators.

If ‘will’ is a modal expression, what is its semantic analysis? The classical approach by Angelika Kratzer treats modals as existential or universal quantifiers over a contextually provided set of possible worlds (see Kratzer 2012 and references therein). For instance, a sentence such as ‘Mary might be in Chicago’ requires, on its epistemic interpretation, the existence of an epistemically possible world at which Mary is in Chicago (where a world counts as epistemically possible just in case it is compatible with some contextually salient information carrier). Among existing modal analyses of future auxiliaries, the canonical view is that ‘will’ is a universal quantifier over a suitably restricted set of historical or epistemic alternatives (see, e.g., Kaufmann 2005 and Giannakidou and Mari 2017). The canon, Cariani argues in Chapter 4, faces a variety of substantial problems. To sketch one striking consideration: ‘will’ fails to enter into scope relations that seemingly would be available if it were an ordinary modal expression. To wit, (8a) and (8b) have the ring of equivalence:

(8) (a) The gardener won’t do it.

      (b) It is not the case that the gardener will do it.

To use a label from Cariani and Paolo Santorio (2018), ‘will’ is “scopeless” with respect to negation. Ordinary modals, in contrast, do enter into non-trivial scope relations with negation:

(9) (a) It must not be the gardener who did it.

      (b) It is not the case that it must be the gardener who did it.

      (c) It doesn’t have to be the gardener who did it.


(10) (a) It might not be the gardener who did it.

        (b) It is not the case that it might be the gardener who did it.   

        (c) It can’t be the gardener who did it.

In both cases, we detect scope interactions between the modal and the negation operator. (9a), for instance, rules out the gardener as the culprit; in contrast, (9b), paraphrased in (9c), merely suggests that we cannot be certain that it was the gardener. Indeed, scope interactions of this kind are just what we expect if the modals at play are existential or universal quantifiers.

Observations like these may make one want to reconsider the modal future hypothesis: perhaps ‘will’ isn’t a modal after all. Cariani explores a different path: ‘will’ is a modal, but not a quantificational one. The alternative he proposes is a selection function semantics for ‘will.’ Robert Stalnaker (1968) famously appeals to selection functions in his analysis of conditionals: a conditional ‘if A, then C’ is true just in case C is true at the antecedent-verifying world that is selected as “most similar” to the world of evaluation. Likewise, Cariani’s basic proposal for future morphemes (Chapter 5) is that ‘will A’ is true just in case A is true at whatever world the selection function picks from the historical alternatives to the world of evaluation (i.e., those worlds that have the same past at the world of evaluation). Cariani further proposes to restrict the selection function so that in unembedded cases, the world selected just is the world of evaluation itself; unembedded ‘will A’ is thus equivalent to A (the equivalence need not hold in embeddings that affect the input of the selection function, say if ‘will’ occurs in the consequent of a conditional). Independently of that constraint, a selection semantics for ‘will’ delivers its scopelessness with respect to negation straightaway: since A is either true or false at whatever world ends up being selected, ‘will A or will not A’ is a tautology.[3]

Cariani moves on to elaborate his selection semantics for future morphemes in considerable detail (Part III). One important question here is how to accommodate the future temporal orientation of future morphemes without introducing unwelcome scopal interactions between negation and ‘will’ after all—an issue that Cariani elegantly addresses by drawing on insights from Cleo Condoravdi’s (2001) account of future orientation in modals (Chapter 7).

The resulting framework is an attractive one; its key underlying choice of a selection semantics over a quantificational one, however, does not strike me as inevitable. In Kratzer’s analysis, modal domains are determined using two contextually provided parameters: a “modal domain” and some “ordering source” that ranks worlds in the modal domain—modals are (roughly) existential or universal quantifiers over those worlds. This setup allows for ties between worlds, in the sense that two or more worlds in the modal domain can pass as equally similar in light of the relevant ordering source. But it is also perfectly compatible with the existence of ordering sources that induce a linear order on the elements of the modal domain—all worlds “fall on a line” and there are no ties—with the world of evaluation as its minimal element.[4] So, if we think of the modal domain for ‘will’ as the historical alternatives to the world of evaluation and of its ordering source as inducing a linear order on that set—again with the world of evaluation as the minimal element—scopelessness with respect to negation once again follows straightaway (so do, as far as I could determine, the other facts about ‘will’ that Cariani points to in order to motivate a selection function approach). This point, for sure, has a bit of a technical flavor, but it also has broader methodological implications: accounting for the data in a quantificational analysis of ‘will’ preserves a uniform outlook on the nature of natural language modality; it also ensures that the analysis of ‘will’ seamlessly interacts with existing (quantificational) proposals for other modal expressions. Indeed, in Chapter 6, Cariani observes that his basic selection semantics for future auxiliaries does not play properly with epistemic modals and attitude verbs: it does not, for instance, predict non-trivial embeddings of ‘will’ under epistemic ‘might.’ While rather straightforward embellishments to the basic proposal take care of this bug, no such bug fixing seems necessary in the first place if we opt for a quantificational (but still empirically adequate) analysis of future auxiliaries.

The final two parts of Cariani's book address themes surrounding future talk and thought beyond its semantic content (the selection function semantics forms an important background assumption for some but not all of the chapters here). One noteworthy issue here concerns a basic question about the norms governing discourse about the future: how can we make assertions about a genuinely open future? Cariani argues that this question amounts to real trouble for the view that future contingents are neither true nor false (Chapter 10).[5] Truth seems to be a norm of assertion; if so, future contingents are never assertable, contrary to the facts.

Cariani officially remains agnostic about openness but suggests that we can make good sense of it within a bivalent thin red line framework on which one particular future is ours even when multiple futures are consistent with the present (Chapter 11). Future claims have classical truth-values, even though there is a distinct sense in which they are not ‘settled’: the facts about the discourse situation underdetermine which future it is that we are actually facing.

Since future truth is often indeterminate, so is whether the truth norm of assertion is satisfied or not. That indeterminacy is resolved as we progress in time. So, for instance, an assertion of the future contingent ‘There will be a sea battle tomorrow’ has an indeterminate truth-value in discourse at the time of utterance, and so whether it violates the truth norm of assertion is indeterminate as well. Things will be resolved tomorrow, in one way or another: if the sea battle does indeed happen, the assertion comes true and the norm is determinately satisfied; if it does not happen, the norm is now determinately violated.

This is a fascinating proposal, one that I take to be compatible with a variety of approaches to the semantics of future auxiliaries. Specifically, while it seems right to say that trivalent semantic approaches that treat future contingents as neither true nor false have trouble making sense of the truth norm for assertion, the spirit of Cariani’s proposal seems adoptable in a trivalent system if we choose to interpret the third truth-value as ‘indeterminate.’ Questions of implementation aside, it cannot be the final word on the pragmatics of future discourse. Knowledge is often claimed to be a norm of assertion as well (e.g., in Williamson 2000), but it is not obvious how one can know that p if the truth of p is indeterminate. Cariani suggests, in passing, that we should think about knowledge about the future as potentially indeterminate as well—the reader is here referred to Cariani (forthcoming) for additional details—and so that the proposal for the truth norm generalizes to also cover the knowledge norm for future assertions (Chapter 11, fn. 10). Still, one would like to hear how, for instance, such norms can guide our discursive practices: one might think that a responsible speaker will make an assertion only if they have reason to think the applicable norms of assertion are indeed satisfied. But even in the case of a well-supported contingent prediction, it should be perfectly transparent to a competent speaker that it is indeterminate as to whether the truth (or knowledge) norm of assertion is satisfied—how then could the speaker have any reason to think it is actually (and not just indeterminately) satisfied? There is plenty to explore further here.

Cariani's book combines serious and perceptive work in natural language semantics with insightful reflections on the pragmatics, epistemology, and cognition of our thought and talk about the future. While certain foundational theory choices do not strike me as inevitable, the resulting framework is elegant and predictively powerful. Cariani’s book is a benchmark for future inquiry into how we think and talk about the future.


Thanks to Fabrizio Cariani and to Ginger Schultheis for helpful comments and discussion.


Cariani, Fabrizio. Forthcoming. ‘Human Foreknowledge.’ Philosophical Perspectives.

Cariani, Fabrizio, and Paolo Santorio. 2018. ‘Will Done Better: Selection Semantics, Future Credence, and Indeterminacy.’ Mind 127(505): 129–165.

Condoravdi, Cleo. 2001. ‘Temporal Interpretation of Modals: Modals for the Present and for the Past.’ In The Construction of Meaning, eds. David I. Beaver, Lucas D. Casillas Martínez, Brady Z. Clark, and Stefan Kaufmann, 59–88. Stanford, CA: CSLI Publications.

Giannakidou, Anastasia, and Alda Mari. 2017. ‘A Unified Analysis of the Future as Epistemic Modality.’ Natural Language and Linguistic Theory 36(1): 85–129.

Kaufmann, Stefan. 2005. ‘Conditional Truth and Future Reference.’ Journal of Semantics 22(3): 231–280.

Klecha, Peter. 2014. ‘Diagnosing Modality in Predictive Expressions.’ Journal of Semantics 31(3): 443–455.

Kratzer, Angelika. 2012. Modals and Conditionals. New York: Oxford University Press.

Łukasiewicz, Jan. 1968. ‘On Determinism.’ The Polish Review 13(3): 47–61.

Stalnaker, Robert. 1968. ‘A Theory of Conditionals.’ In Studies in Logical Theory, ed. Nicholas Rescher, 98–112. Oxford: Blackwell.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.


[1] It is difficult to identify a clear-cut criterion for modal talk, not least due to the large variety of tools and techniques that are employed in contemporary analyses of natural language modality. Cariani takes “worldly displacement” to be a sufficient criterion (Section 3.1) so that e.g., μ qualifies as a modal propositional operator if in evaluating ‘μA’ at some world w, we end up asking whether A is true or false at worlds other than (but perhaps including) w. Expressions whose semantics is free of displacement may still qualify as modals, if a case can be made for it.

[2] Cariani focuses on ‘will,’ but the case seems to generalize to future auxiliaries more generally, including ‘going to.’

[3] Hence the fact that not will entails will not is just an instance of disjunctive syllogism; the reverse follows since A and its negation cannot both be true at a selected world.

[4] In a bit more detail, we can let f(w0)={w0, …, wn} be the modal base for will at w0, understood as the historical alternatives to w0. The ordering source o is a set of propositions so that w≺v just in case (i) for all p ∈ o, if p is true at v, p is also true at w and (ii) for some p ∈ o, p is true at w but p is false at v. An ordering source such as g(w0)={ {w0}, {w0,w1},…, {w0,w1,…, wn} } then induces a linear ordering on f(w0) with w0 as the minimal element. This proposal makes the (controversial) limit assumption in that it assumes the existence of a minimal element in the modal domain, and it is also natural to wonder how the order beyond w0 is established. But it is difficult to derive a dialectical disadvantage for a quantificational proposal on these grounds alone: a selection function semantics makes the limit assumption as well and it is just as natural to wonder how worlds are selected from sets that do not include the world of evaluation.

[5] This is the view promoted by Łukasiewicz (1968) as well the “anti-realist” reading of Aristotle’s remarks on future contingents in De Interpretatione.