The Monstrosity of Christ: Paradox or Dialectic?

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Slavoj Žižek and John Milbank, The Monstrosity of Christ: Paradox or Dialectic?, Creston Davis (ed.), MIT Press, 2009, 312pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262012713.

Reviewed by John D. Caputo, Syracuse University



Materialism just isn’t what it used to be. Nowadays everyone wants to be a materialist, even the theologians, while the materialists want to look like they lead a spiritual life. The battle that is joined today is no longer between materialism and idealism, or hard-nosed Newtonians and far out spirit-seers, but between “materialist materialism” and “theological materialism”, between crude soulless materialism and materialism with spirit, a materialism of the spirit, a religious materialism (93). “Materialist materialism is simply not as materialist as theological materialism”, says John Milbank, the leading Anglo-Catholic theologian of the day, in this published debate with Slavoj Žižek, a Lacanian neo-Marxist writer and something of a Slovenian philosophical sensation in the Anglophone world (206). Theological materialism goes back to Christology, the materialism of the Logos made matter, in which matter really matters. Žižek would agree, but he would stand this statement on its head in a resuscitated and refashioned neo-Hegelian death of God theology. The debate that unfolds is strikingly Christological, in which both parties agree that Christianity is the absolute truth (Hegel), where Milbank takes his Christology straight up (treating Žižek’s as a “counterfeit”) and Žižek takes his on the rocks (treating Milbank’s version as “imaginary” (153, 245). The book is a splendid condensation and cross section of a contemporary debate between writers who seek to position themselves beyond the postmodernism or poststructuralism that dominated the last few decades of European thought. Whatever one thinks of the views of Milbank or Žižek, we may be very grateful to editor Creston Davis for crafting such a first rate exchange.

Milbank, an Anglican theologian who started out in Theology and Social Theory (1990) offering a robust defense of the Christian “meta-discourse”, now thinks the best defense for materialism lies in “metaphysics”, in nothing less than the Christian metaphysics of St. Thomas, the venerable metaphysics of analogy and the participation of being first restored to a place of honor in Catholicism by Pope Leo XIII. For Milbank, to embrace materialism materialistically is to embrace matter in itself, and that is nothing but nihilism. For the material world in itself, apart from God, is nothing at all. To embrace materialism theologically, however, is to see the material world as a created share and reflection of the goodness and glory of God, just as Christ, who did not think equality with God something to cling to, embraced the domain of fleshy matter even unto death. But it is precisely Christ, and the death of Christ, which Žižek seizes upon and presses to the end. Following Hegel, Žižek denies the distinction between the immanent and economic Trinity, between the generation of the Son and the creation of the world. For him, the absolute in itself (Father) negates itself in order to empty itself without remainder into the world (Son), of which the Christ is a singular sign, constituting a kind of first death or kenotic emptying of the Father/God. That negation is in turn negated in the Crucifixion, in which nothing less than the God(-man) himself dies, which allows the emergence of the collective “spirit”. The supreme moment of dark lucidity is Jesus’s lament “My God, my God, why have you forsaken me?” At that point, the horizon is wiped out, and the cold black truth is exposed that no one (save ourselves) is coming over the horizon to save us, that we are sustained by no overarching cosmic support. We are on our own. Just as in psychoanalysis, Žižek says elsewhere, the treatment is over when the patient realizes there is no “Big Other” (God or Man, Nation or Party, Father or Big Brother, Lacan’s symbolic order or what Derrida called the “transcendental signifier”).

The odd title of the book, which proffers a new Christological title (“monstrosity”), goes back to a line from Hegel’s lectures on the philosophy of religion describing the expression “God-man” as a “monstrous compound” (74). For Milbank this means that Christ represents a magnificent monstration of God’s love for the world, which takes the form of the excessive “paradox” of God-made-man. For Žižek, it means that Christ is the monstrous moment of the death on the cross in which God himself loses faith and confesses the death of God, which is the theological result demanded by the “dialectic”. So the whole book unfolds as a theological and Christological bidding war aimed at deciding whether paradox or dialectic holds the most chips when it comes to making matter matter more. In this corner Milbank’s radically orthodox theology with a straight face, in that corner Žižek’s radically ironic, heterodox and subversive theology. Žižek has to work harder because the match takes place in the theologian’s ring. But Žižek is undaunted; he is used to being the visiting team and knows no limit to the cultural material he will address. Žižek’s readings of G. K. Chesterton and Meister Eckhart, of the Trinity and the Incarnation, are obviously more eccentric than those of Milbank, who clearly holds the home field advantage.

Significantly the debate is not between theology and anti-theology. That is a sign of the times, of a “theological turn” among European intellectuals, even of the most hardened neo-Marxist sort, all of whom turn to theology for help in addressing basic questions in ontology and political theory. This turn cuts a wide swath, including Jewish post-structuralist figures like Emmanuel Levinas and Jacques Derrida (on the “wholly other”, tout autre), the “saturated phenomenology” of the Catholic Jean-Luc Marion, and the controversial interpretation of St. Paul by neo-Marxist Alain Badiou, which drew Giorgio Agamben and Žižek into the debate. Although it would make Žižek and (less so) Milbank uncomfortable to say so, there is nothing else to call this turn but “postmodern”, if postmodernism means a recognition of hybridity, a weakening of rigid modernist binarities like matter/spirit, faith/reason, objective/subjective, philosophy/theology. Their debate is whether this hybrid monster is to be interpreted dialectically or analogically. Of course, for the most part these authors cannot think of things mean enough to say about postmodernism, which they both regard as a spineless and indecisive compromise with late capitalism, pluralism and liberal individualism. On their telling, postmodernism means that Platonic truth collapses into relativistic “conversation”, decision dissolves into a pool of undecidability, genuine political action into political correctness, and love into sexual libertinism. In this regard, whatever their differences, both authors ride a high theological horse. Both love G. K. Chesterton’s old chestnuts about orthodoxy offering the most radical revolution, or about past papal censures of scientific research providing reason its best protection. That produces some more monsters: Milbank (an Anglican) is happy to invoke the Pope to counter the Reformation and Žižek happily calls himself a Stalinist to counter democracy; Milbank defends “Red Toryism” and pleads that paternalism has its bright side and Žižek wants us to see the rose in the cross of an “austere socialist dictatorship” (292). That leaves their readers to decide just how much they actually mean these things, and just how much we should love these monsters.

The core theoretical debate in this book goes back to Hegel, about which Milbank and Žižek share considerable agreement. For Hegel, the fundamental motor of time and becoming is dialectical reconciliation of the members of a binary oppositional pair in virtue of which each one tends to pass into the other on a higher level. But Žižek rejects Hegel’s invocation of “reconciliation” of opposites in a happier harmony. For Žižek the next step, the negation of the negation, does not mean a step up (aufheben) to a higher plane of unity but instead a more radically negative negation in which we are led to see that this mutual antagonism is all there is and that we are going to have to work through it. The unreconciled is real and the real is unreconciled. The only reconciliation is to reconcile ourselves to the irreconcilable, to admit that there is no reconciliation, and to come to grips with it. The negation of the negation leaves us with a deeper negation, not with an affirmation. It is not that the spirit is first whole, then wounded, then healed; rather such healing as is available to it comes by getting rid of the idea of being whole to begin with. The antithesis is already the synthesis (72). Žižek seeks thereby to relieve us of what he regards as a “scarecrow” Hegel, where a reconciliation is all the while going on up above, in a higher “Mega-subject” called the “Spirit” which works its wily ways through individual empirical subjects all in the name of the necessary unfolding of Reason (26, 60-61). The “totalizing” Hegel criticized by postmodernists is completely apocryphal and makes a mockery of Hegel’s respect for contingency and individuality. In its place, Žižek sees an owl-of-Minerva Hegel who describes an after-the-fact rationale for what has in fact unfolded contingently, whose genius lay in his Monday morning quarterbacking, his gift of finding a pattern in contingency, while conceding that a good deal of blood was spilled in the process (246-47). Far from describing the movements of a Super-Subject-Spirit, Hegel confronts us with the cold and merciless realization that things are what they are, where instead of infusing the real with the rational, the rational is reduced to the real, to the realization that we are the only ones who know we are here and as for us, we are on our own.

This is a ruthless demythologization of Hegel’s Spirit. The Spirit is a “virtual” community, by which Žižek does not mean an “online” but an imaginary community, individuals bound together by their “subjective presuppositions”, which they discover they themselves have posited to begin with. But instead of a simple “positing”, which is something purely subjective (that is as far as Feuerbach got), Žižek offers the notion of a contingent multitude that organizes itself and self-mediates, engendering and positing its own immanent necessity. It retroactively posits its own essence or presuppositions. The subject sees it has itself posited what appears to it as its own presuppositions (76). Rather than saying that individuals organize themselves immediately into collectivities, Žižek describes a transubjective “it” that organizes itself. That requires a “mediator”, some singular individual — like the King, the Leader, or Christ, each of whom is a monstrous compound of some sort. This individual is not just a miserable man, but a King, His Majesty, or the Son of God, etc., whose role is to provide a mediation between the individuals and the collectivity, the existential occasion (the “event”) upon which something gets itself organized in us. The result is that there is neither a mere assemblage of atomic individuals, as in liberal individualism, nor an absolute Mega-Spirit, as in Stalinism or Nazism, where there are no individuals, just the Party or the “Big Other”. Liberal Individualism and Stalinism are the recto and the verso of each other; what they both lack is the auto-organizing or auto-emergent collectivity, which is a necessity recognized after the fact (76-78). The necessity is not just lying there waiting to be discovered by us, as in a pre-critical idea of truth, but constitutes our way to truth, which is part of the truth process itself. Our discovery of eternal truth generates eternal truth, as a retroactive appearance or constitution of necessity (78). We construct what we discover; we produce what organizes us.

Milbank is in substantial agreement with Žižek’s reading of Hegel as a negative dialectics (112). Readers who see in Hegel an Aristotelian who translates teleological intelligibility into time and history, whose model is organic and biological growth (among whom we should include Hegel himself), will have a hard time recognizing the Hegel who appears in these pages. Milbank does think that Žižek goes too far with the idea of contingency by missing the “uniquely revelatory” power of Christ himself (114). According to Milbank, Hegel is a dualist, holding at once to a purely formal and necessitarian account of the logical advance of the categories while treating the material content of actuality as absolutely contingent (which is like Hegel’s criticism of natural religion). Actualities are not the organic expression of absolute life, not the gradual realization of an unfolding logic, but a random outburst of contingencies forced into an after-the-fact formalism, of blind nominalist actualities submitted to a pure formal logic. Hegel is Scotus, who is the root of all evil. For this reason Milbank thinks Žižek cannot escape between the horns of individualism and totalitarianism. Going back to Gillian Rose’s Dialectic of Nihilism, Milbank treats negative dialectics as manifest nihilism, a philosophy of the void and negativity, an ontology of violence, which issues in a politics of the violent war of all with all, around which, in his view, all modern political, social and economic theory revolves. The negative dialectic is complete when we see that all there is, is the plurality of contingencies, a kind of positivistic demythologizing reading of Hegel (152). This is like a demythologizing of the “destiny of Being” in Heidegger where "es gibt" just means “there is what there is — and that is all there is”. For Milbank, Žižek is not a Romantic Schellingian but a Hegelian rationalist, lacking a sense of mystery, of any excess beyond reason, of the untapped reserve of the symbol or of poetry, for whom reason exposes “the inscrutable absurdity of reality taken as a whole”, offering us an atheism that takes every opportunity to mime theology (158).

That breaks the great promise one might have thought Hegel held — of being the last great Christian philosopher, of defeating abstract and alienated Enlightenment thinking and liberal individualism, the promise to invoke a Christian and indeed Trinitarian paradigm and to have recourse to a deeply relational and reconciliatory thought. In the place of Hegel’s broken promise Milbank would put an ontology of primordial peace and reconciliation, “the (unreachable and untraceable) prelapsarian golden age”, made possible only by means of a metaphysics of analogy (171). By invoking the analogical standpoint, we are able to see that the tempests that brew here below in time and space, the oppositions and conflicts we everywhere encounter, sometimes dialectical, sometimes not, are more deeply grounded in the ground of being. These conflicts send us hurtling into dialectical opposition, into war, only if we do not look up and see these opposites in their point of coincidence (Eckhart, Cusanus), in the subsistent being of God (Aquinas) — of which they are themselves finite and partial reflections, from which they themselves derive their own being, through which they are finally reconciled. The metaphysics of analogy supports the rhetoric of paradox. If we are to learn from Hegel, who would take us beyond modernity (Enlightenment), it can only be by reading him back into what lies before modernity, the Trinitarian theology of Augustine and (even more in Milbank’s recent work) the metaphysics of participation of Thomas Aquinas. In Aquinas, dialectics yields to analogy, to the tripartite logic deriving from Thomas’s commentary on the apophatic theology of Pseudo-Dionysius, of which Hegel’s negative dialectics is the degradation. In Dionysius, affirmation (God is good) yields to negation (not good in the way we know) which passes into eminence (but with a higher goodness). The finite and competing worldly goods we experience derive from and analogically resemble the infinite and mysterious goodness of God, where justice and mercy, freedom and providence, are identical because they are found there eminentiore modo. In Augustine, the war of all with all (amor sui) in the city of man yields to a metaphysics of relation and person in the city formed around the love of God (amor dei), where there is no such thing as one person, where a person is a subsistent relationship among persons, who do not form an exclusive relation of two, but an inclusive community of tripartite open-ended love.

For Žižek, Milbank’s ontology of peace is so much fantasy — does Milbank think that there really was a prelapsarian age? — an unchecked exercise in what Lacan called the imaginary, or of Nietzsche’s observation that the power of an idea to comfort us is no guarantee of its truth (245-6). We require a more merciless view of reality (and the Real), a colder truth, if we are going to make it through the day. Žižek is a realist in the sense that he is encouraging us to realize that help is not on the way, that no one is going to save us, save ourselves. This realism springs from his Lacanian notion of the Real, of the deep cut in our hides, the profound trauma by which we are constituted, the impossibility of a deep and fulfilling jouissance and its replacement by the endless and futile search for precisely what we cannot have. It is clearly Lacan who steers Žižek’s reading of Hegel as a negative dialectics, since on the standard version of Hegel we are being teleologically steered into the precise parousiological fulfillment that Žižek says we are denied. It is the influence of Lacan that gives the place of honor to the power of the negative, of the negation of the negation as the realization that the cut, the trauma, is the alpha and omega, that the incision is decisive. But Žižek is not a realist in the epistemological sense; far from it. What matters for him is our ability to sustain our fantasies, to act as if we have a grip on things. What keeps us going, what organizes collective action, is to embrace the Cause, to love and serve it fiercely, for that is what mobilizes subjectivity and produces results. That is why St. Paul is an important paradigm for both Badiou and Žižek. The actual content of Paul’s preaching, the resurrected Christ, is a complete myth, to be sure. Nobody’s perfect. Nevertheless the form of Paul’s conversion is the very paradigm of the constitution of the militant subject and of the (apostolic) resoluteness to spread the revolution around the world. Paul is the paradigm of Lacan’s injunction to remain true to one’s desire. It is like, almost exactly like, I would say, a patient who resolves to sustain a belief in the narrative the psychoanalyst is constructing, regardless of whether it is true, because believing the analyst is the only way out of this hole.

So what about materialism?

The materialism that Žižek finally defends is not very materialistic, not because like Milbank it is supported by an analogical distribution of being from created material beings up through uncreated immaterial being, but because no theoretical physicist today thinks the physical world is all that physical. The particles and quanta of energy, the waves and impulses of contemporary physics, make a mockery of the “crude” materialism of billiard board atoms bouncing around in empty space according to fixed and predetermining laws. In contemporary physics, the world is “incomplete” and indeterminate, like a Google map that is determinate only at the level of the observer, which can in turn become more or less determinate as the need arises, when we zoom in or out. The critical point, Žižek points out, is that this is not a merely epistemological observation about the observer, but an ontological point about the “ontological incompleteness” or indeterminate status of physical reality itself (90). So Žižek speaks of a “spectral materialism”, which includes the digitalization of information, the genetic code and quantum physics. A true materialism rejoices in the disappearance of matter into the void (91-92). The metaphysics that best fits this physics is that of Badiou, who is the true materialist precisely because Badiou’s ontological-mathematical formalism steers clear of an ontology of life or élan vitale of the sort we find in Bergson or Deleuze. Badiou is for the same reason the true atheist. As Milbank points out, any qualitative intensification of being - like élan vitale, Deleuze’s “crowned virtuality” or Heidegger’s mysterious Sein - represents a failure of atheistic nerve and a drift towards a kind of divinity (150). The Hegel that Žižek thinks Badiou incarnates in fact seems to represent exactly what Hegel criticized under the name of the “prose of the world” in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, the prosaic world, natural things divested of their divinity, various collections of neutral grey empirical objects. This is confirmed by Peter Hallward’s book on Deleuze (Out of This World), which argues that there is nothing to stop us from understanding the plane of immanence as the field of a theophany in which the creative forces are realized in created actualities, which actualize its virtualities. Such a materialism, unlike its 19th century antecedents, is not reductionistic. Material forces are all there are but there is always more to the material world than matter, which bears the structure of the “non-all”. There are always phenomena like “consciousness” which have a positive non-being or non-materiality, not because consciousness is an angelic or an immaterial substance, but because there is always an incompleteness in reality, a subjective point of view on reality. Moreover, this atheism is likewise “positive”, not a simple naturalistic denial of God, as in Christopher Hitchins or Richard Dawkins.

Žižek provocatively suggests an odd kind of “positive” unbelief in an undead God, like the “undead” in the novels of Stephen King, a “spectral” belief that is never simple disbelief along with a God who is never simply dead (101). God is dead but we continue to (un)believe in the ghost of god, in a living dead god. If atheism (“I don’t believe in God”) is the negation of belief (“I believe in God”), what is the negation of that negation? It is not a higher living spirit of faith that reconciles belief and unbelief but a negation deeper than a simple naturalistic and reactionary atheism (like Hitchins and Dawkins). Belief is not aufgehoben but rather not quite killed off, even though it is dead. It is muted, erased but surviving under erasure, like seeing Marley’s ghost even though Scrooge knows he is dead these twenty years; like a crossed out letter we can still read, oddly living on in a kind of spectral condition. Things are neither black nor white but shifting, spectral, incomplete. We have bid farewell to God, adieu to the good old God (à Dieu), farewell to the Big Other, Who Makes Everything Turn Out Right, Who Writes Straight with Crooked Lines, who maketh me to lie down in green pastures. Still, that negation of negation does not spell the simple death of belief but its positive mode in which belief, while dead, lives on (sur/vivre). This unbelief would be the “pure form” of belief, and if belief is the substance of the things that appear not, Žižek proposes a belief deprived of substance as well as of appearance. Žižek mocks Derrida mercilessly, but when spaceship Žižek finally lands, when this buzzing flutterbug named Žižek finally alights, one has to ask, exactly how far has he landed from Derrida’s “spectral messianic”? Is the difference, as Milbank asks, merely one of tone — and gratuitous insults (118)?

In a debate like this it is hard to resist a desire to put a pox on both their houses. What strikes me first about the debate is the irony by which both positions are sustained, both the ironic materialism of Milbank and the ironic religion of Žižek. Milbank makes no bones about the fact that the goal of his argument is to lie down in green pastures with his friends on the other side, that the whole point of the theory of analogical participation is to break the bite of matter where matter matters most (death). He may be a critic of dialectics but it seems to me the tripartite movement of affirmation, negation and eminence is dialectics at an even higher velocity. The irreducible heart of Milbank’s Augustinian-Thomistic analogy is to insure that matter does not have the last word, that there is room in matter to triumph over death, to enter a domain where the bite of space and time and corruptible flesh have been vanquished. Then we will live on with imperishable bodies made of who knows what, of matter of some sort or other, matter eminentiore modo, but certainly not matter in any sense that matters. That is why too when Chesterton speaks of “a matter more dark and awful” we know to take this matter with a grain of salt, that Chesterton is only willing to go so far with these dark matters. We all know that this is all part of a Chestertonian rhetoric of reversals, a smug apologetic of Christian faith in which things are continually stood on their head (which is the part that Žižek admires) in order to make sure that we all end up upright and resurrected. For Chesterton there is nothing really dark and awful at all, not in the end, not at the eschaton, when things are not dark but light, not awful but glorious. Chesterton is like a predictable formula novelist whose stories always have a happy ending, and whose art is to try to persuade the reader that this time the hero is really done for and will not survive. What we admire is not the heroism of the hero, whose fate was never really at risk, but the art of the novelist in throwing a phony scare into us, as if something awful were about to happen, which never does. The one thing we know when we read Chesterton, if we do not tire too quickly of the completely predictable topsy-turvy logic, is that he speaking of the Incarnation and the divine economy of salvation, of bright and glorious salvation, and that the very last thing to which he would ever subscribe is the matter more dark and awful of the abyss of real and absolute loss.

What Žižek does with Chesterton is to take him at his word, which of course is exactly what Chesterton never imagined anyone would do; that would have completely scandalized Chesterton. That is why in the case of both Eckhart and Chesterton, Milbank has the exegetical edge, the home field advantage. Žižek says in effect, let us take Chesterton by surprise and actually believe him, which is a highly ironic strategy. Žižek really does think that human existence is broken from the start by a dark and awful traumatic cut with which we are asked to come to grips. Furthermore, we all know that Žižek can very well make his main case with no mention of Christ at all, that he can use the seminars of Lacan, the films of Alfred Hitchcock or the novels of Stephen King just as well. His whole point, as he says elsewhere, is subversive: to build a Trojan-horse theology, to slip the nose of a more radical materialism under the Pauline tent of theology in order to announce the death of God. If he had not decided to get into this particular discussion with the theologians, if Badiou had not managed to catch his fancy with Paul, then Christ would have nothing to do with this argument and play no role in it at all. For truth to tell, Žižek doesn’t think there is a God himself who dies. Never was. The treatment is over when we realize that. No more than he thinks that Stephen King’s characters are real empirical individuals. “Christ” for him is a nickname for a way to contract the void, and the Passion story is an allegory or Vorstellung of a philosophical point he can make in any number of ways. He discusses Christian doctrines like the Trinity, the Incarnation and the Crucifixion the way an analyst talks with a patient who thinks there is a snake under his bed, trying patiently to heal the patient by going along with the patient’s illusions until the patient is led to see the illusion. Žižek agrees with Chesterton the way the analyst agrees with the patient, where the whole question is, how do we deal with this snake, as he is obviously quite large and growing larger with every day. Then at some precisely timed and strategic point, the analyst softly asks, " Do you think perhaps it is something else disturbing your sleep?“

”NDPRBodyTexT0" style="">I am led from irony to incredulity. As I do not think that matter is ultimately the matter at issue for Milbank, or that Christ is the issue for Žižek, I am also overwhelmed by a compelling sense of how uncompelling is either view. What exactly is the compelling need we are under to agree with either one of these positions or to choose between them? Why do we have to love either one of these monsters? Why do we need the notion that at the metaphysical base of things there lies either a primordial peace or a primordial violence — or a primordial anything, at least one that we could ever get our hands on? Why do the multiple repetitions of which our lives are woven need to be cast either as a downbeat and futile search that will be always frustrated or as underwritten by an uplifting metaphysics of participation? Why inscribe either absolute contradiction or absolute peace at the heart of things instead of ambience and ambiguity? Why chaos instead of the unsteady chaosmotic process of unprogrammed becoming? Why not see life as a joyful but risky business that may turn out well or badly, a repetition forwards in which I produce what I am repeating, in which I invent what I am discovering, but in which I am divested of any assurances about what lies up ahead — let alone deep down at the metaphysical base of things? Žižek’s notion of the contingency of necessity is close to this insight, but he insists on treating the Deep Trauma like some Metaphysical Meteor that cratered downtown Ljubljana. Is this not just the search for a transcendental signifier all over again? Why do we have to believe that something deep is out there but alas it is lost and we are hopelessly searching for it? That is repetition as reproduction. Why not rather say that by searching for it, it is there, produced by the repetition? The repetition is generative, engendering, positing something not merely as a dream but by the dream, the active dreaming of the dream, the dreaming up, which gathers momentum as we dream, repeat, desire, pray and weep, over the coming of something whose coming we are engendering, or is being engendered, as the very structure of desire. Dreaming is the pharmakon, a risky supplement, a joy that flows through our veins that is liable to poison us if we are not careful. Nothing is lost from which we have been traumatically cut off. This is just desire desiring, what desire does, how it works, its happy work, and if desire is a fault, it is a happy fault.

Why not adopt the post-metaphysical idea that gives up searching for all such primordial underlying somethings or other? Why must we posit either a primordial loss or a primordial gain? Is there some reason we get only two choices, either God as an illusion spun by the objet petit a or God as the Alpha and Omega, the really real and really Big A? Is this not simply metaphysics spinning its wheels all over again, a point Milbank supports when he says neither of these views can be proven (153)? All that is truly given is a promise/risk, what Derrida calls a “perhaps” not reducible to one or the other. Why must we believe that underneath it all is something profoundly productive or destructive? Why not simply confess that the “matter” that really matters is the risky matter of life, life marked by an unknowable and fundamental undecidability, an ineradicable secret or mystery which reminds us that we do not know who we are, that we do not know what is (deeply) what or what we truly want, yet to make this confession without nostalgia and without despair and without theological triumphalism but with a joyful sense of discovery? I readily agree that something important is contracted in the name of Jesus, that this name harbors a marvelous mysterious event, a monstrous monstration, a perplexing paradoxical poetics. All this I locate in the reversals that mark the Kingdom of God, where the first are last, the outsiders are in and the insiders are out. But I do not see that this marvel must amount to either Žižek’s void or Milbank’s metaphysics of participation. Rather the marvel is the promise/risk of mercy and love, of compassion and forgiveness, and that is all we know on earth and all we need to know. Does anyone really think the Sermon on the Mount has anything to do with any of this bombastic metaphysical tilting and jousting?

Speaking of the Sermon on the Mount, I move finally from irony and incredulity to alarm — about the violence of this book. Žižek has not the slightest compunction about invoking violence and he owes it to his readers to be clear about what he means, how far he would go and under what circumstances. Milbank on the other hand batters our ears with a barrage of rhetorical violence, with the vintage violence of theological imperialism — is there any other? — a disturbing and dogmatic theological dismissiveness of anyone who disagrees with him — or, as it is more and more turning out, with the metaphysics of Thomas Aquinas. Milbank and the authors who swim around him in the “school” of “Radical Orthodoxy” flatter themselves with the insufferable conceit that the entire world may be divided into either medieval Thomistic metaphysicians — or nihilists! They remind us, in case we might have forgotten, why no one trusts theology.

Truth to tell, I think Jesus (who does not even make the index in this book) would have been utterly dumbfounded by this polemic about the metaphysics of Christ.