The Moral Complexities of Eating Meat

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Ben Bramble and Bob Fischer, (eds.), The Moral Complexities of Eating Meat, Oxford University Press, 2016, 217pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199353903.

Reviewed by Tyler Doggett, University of Vermont


The ethics of eating meat is a hot topic. Many things food-philosophical are. Since 2012, Oxford University Press, Reaktion, Rowman and Littlefield, Routledge, and the University of California Press have all published books on food and philosophy.[1] Since then, NDPR has published seven reviews of books in the partly-overlapping field of animal ethics. More books are coming.

The Moral Complexities of Eating Meat is a valuable addition to the literature and a very good book. It contains twelve new essays and a short introduction from the editors. Some of these essays are orthodox. Some of them are heterodox. Some are on newer topics. Most are on older topics but make new contributions. Even the most orthodox, familiar pieces are full of striking insights and ideas for new directions. There are sharp, riveting asides about anti-natalism, bug-eating, comparative accounts of harm, duties to pets and prey animals, and so on. It would be easy to write a 2500-word review of each piece rather than of the whole thing.

The book is split into three parts: Defending Meat, Challenging Meat, and Future Directions. Defending Meat is the shortest. In it, Christopher Belshaw defends the permissibility of killing animals for food by defending the view that death is not bad for them. He argues that, for most adult farm animals, even those living on a free-range farm, life is a grinding, mindful monotony, interrupted by occasional pains. (Young animals, he thinks, have happier, richer lives.) Killing such animals isn't wrong. And then neither is eating them.

J. Baird Callicott derives the same conclusions about free-range farms and about killing and eating animals but does so by arguing for a moral theory, communitarianism, that rivals consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics and then arguing that communitarianism implies -- and explains -- why it is permissible to raise, kill, and eat free-range animals.

Donald W. Bruckner argues that if certain arguments against the permissibility of eating farmed animals for food are sound, then it follows that eating certain sorts of vegetables is likewise impermissible since those vegetables are produced in ways that are harmful to many animals -- field-dwelling animals are killed in the harvest or by pesticides, have their habitat destroyed to plant crops, etc. Yet nothing follows about the impermissibility of eating animals who were neither raised for food nor wrongfully killed, e.g. accidentally roadkilled animals. He argues that the best way to understand these ostensibly vegetarian arguments is that they imply that eating such animals is not just permissible but required.

Challenging Meat is the book's longest section, though not entirely because the challenges to meat are lengthy. Some of the most interesting work has nothing to do with that challenge. So, for example, this argument

It is wrong to raise certain animals for food. Hence,

It is wrong to buy or eat such animals

is clearly invalid. Julia Driver's and Mark Bryant Budolfson's papers are partly about ways to improve it.

Driver argues that meat-eating and meat-buying typically require "participation" in a wrongful system and manifest an attitude towards that system that "constitutes its own form of evil" (77). As she notes, our -- everyone who reads NDPR's -- lives involve repeated participation in various wrongful systems and so the challenge she sets herself at the end of the paper is to explain if and why, say, eating meat is wrong but benefitting from slavery or the extermination of Native Americans isn't.

Budolfson addresses himself to this challenge, too. Like Driver, he argues that consumption of factory-farmed goods is typically wrong. Before that, though, he details the workings of factory farm supply chains in order to substantiate that "there is a good empirical reason to think that the actual effect (and expectation) of a single individual's consumption decisions on production is nearly zero and is not to be equated with the average effect of similar consumption decisions across society" (87).

Clayton Littlejohn, by contrast, denies this. His essay is one part response to I-make-no-difference reasoning ("It can't be wrong for me to buy these McNuggets because, in doing so, I make no difference to any chicken") and one part subtle shoring up of the canonical Argument from Marginal Cases.

Ben Bramble defends the other canonical argument against meat: the one that starts from the premise that it costs animals so much and gains us so little. He works through four objections to it, developing each and then arguing against it, including a bit where he takes the standard "But giving up meat would be such a great cost to me!" objection to it and turns it on its head, arguing that eating meat costs us a great deal psychologically.

Tristram McPherson starts from a familiar omnivorous response to arguments like Bramble's and Littlejohn's: "Of course it's permissible to eat meat. Arguments to the contrary are academic just like arguments for external world skepticism." McPherson then argues that the parallel with external world skepticism is no good and so neither is the response to Bramble and Littlejohn.

Lastly, there's Future Directions. In this section, Alexandra Plakias argues that debates between vegetarians and omnivores of the sort discussed in the book might fruitfully be thought of as debates about what counts as food rather than debates about which foods we may eat. She argues, too, that these debates might be fruitful even if they do nothing to change any minds about the permissibility of meat-eating.

Lori Gruen and Robert Jones note that veganism, understood merely as a dietary practice, is a woefully inadequate response to the moral concerns that motivate that practice. Your merely refusing to consume animal products permits you to benefit from and prop up harms to animals in myriad ways. In the actual world, there is no way to avoid this sort of benefitting and propping up. And doing so is wrong. So Gruen and Jones conceive of veganism as movement towards an ideal -- an inspiring, compelling ideal -- that, in the actual world, is not achievable. So their paper is about the right way to think about veganism but also about the ethics of failure.

Neil Levy's contribution is, in its own way, also about the ethics of failure. He argues that strict vegetarianism can be a bad response to the wrongness -- we're just assuming it's wrong -- of killing animals for food since it leads to the sanctification of one's vegetarianism which, in turn, leads to the demonization of those less sanctified and the view that breaks from vegetarianism are defilements. These responses, in turn, might lead to failure to pursue various vegetarian goals. So far as vegetarians aim at stopping the killing of animals, advocating strict vegetarianism might be counterproductive.

Likewise, Bob Fischer argues that blaming people for eating meat might be counterproductive and also arbitrary and unmotivated. He argues that meat-eating is just one of many things we do that complicity arguments imply are wrongful. If those arguments are sound, we shouldn't do such things. But we all do some of these things and refraining from all of them is too much to ask. So we shouldn't be blamed for doing some of them. And it's arbitrary to single meat-eating out as a thing to blame. So people shouldn't be blamed for meat-eating.

The book has its genesis in the New York Times's write-your-best-defense-of-meat-eating competition -- the editors were each finalists -- but all of the papers in the book are critical of contemporary meat production. Moreover, the number of essays defending the permissibility of eating meat is small: Belshaw's and Callicott's alone do.

Bruckner's piece defends a position some vegetarians would find ethically acceptable. As I said, one question some contributions explicitly grapple with is: how do arguments about production -- about the wrongness of, say, raising and killing animals -- generate conclusions about consumption? Bruckner raises different questions: If those arguments do generate the conclusion that it is wrong to eat farmed animals, do they also generate the conclusion that it is wrong to eat animals period? Do such arguments get quite a bit farther than a requirement not to eat certain sorts of animals? Do they get as far as a requirement not to eat certain sorts of vegetables, namely, those produced using methods that kill animals or destroy animal habitat or are produced in ways that are environmentally destructive?[2]

Bruckner argues that the best way to understand ostensibly vegetarian arguments leads to the conclusion: if given a forced choice between roadkill and industrially-produced soy, produced by killing thousands of small rodents, one ought to eat the roadkill. He then wants to defend the stronger claim that such arguments imply not just the conditional but the consequent: we are morally required to eat roadkill. This is puzzling. But maybe his idea is the radical one that every option other than roadkill has been produced in a way that wrongfully harms animals, roadkill itself has not been produced in such a way, and so if certain arguments about the wrongfulness of harming animals and consuming such animals are sound, then they imply that each of us should eat as much roadkill as we can.

In focusing on eating, Bruckner's essay stands out. There is comparatively little in the book about eating as opposed to buying or producing food. The Levy essay has some fascinating ideas about impurity and eating. The Plakias is partly about how we think of substances as edible, about how moral work is done by the conceptualization of some things -- farmed pigs -- as food and other things -- Fido -- as not. The Driver is partly about whether eating renders one complicit in the wrongful production of animal products. Otherwise, it's a paragraph here and there with very little discussion of freeganism -- the practice of eating anything so long as you don't pay for it -- or the ethics of, say, eating the remnants of your kid's hot dog that will otherwise go to waste or of eating what you're given at a dinner party or this Buddhist practice described by Charles Goodman:

Theravāda monks, who live by begging, are expected to eat whatever food is placed in their bowl, including meat, without preference or discrimination. However, they are forbidden to eat meat from an animal if they have seen, heard, or suspected that the animal in question was killed specifically for them. (Goodman (2014))

This is not a criticism. The relative lack of attention to eating makes sense in light of many of the arguments in the book. On one hand, the book brings out that refusing to eat this or that might be an overreaction to various arguments. It might be that those arguments do not yield conclusions about what to eat. It is an important philosophical question how best to generate conclusions about eating from premises about production, and it is easy to see why philosophers would be particularly focused on answering this question -- it is the kind of thing we are good at. The recurrent discussion -- in Bramble, Bruckner, Budolfson, Driver, Gruen and Jones, Littlejohn -- of I-make-no-difference reasoning is a way of answering this question, doing what we are good at.

Yet, on the other hand, merely refusing to eat this or that might be an underreaction to various arguments. As the book brings out, arguments ostensibly about animals might lead to conclusions that go far beyond permissions to or prohibitions on buying or eating them. Besides duties to buy or eat, there might be duties to political activism. There might be duties owed to farmers. There might be duties to stop others from eating certain things or to stop being friends with people who do so. There might, as Fischer argues, be a duty not to blame. Or, to use Callicott's example, to advocate for the protection of logging jobs. As Driver, Gruen and Jones, and Littlejohn note, refusing to buy or eat might be conceived of as a way of signaling opposition to various things. How else might one be required to so signal? At least half of the essays are, in a way, about all this, about not only the moral complexities of meat-eating but the moral complexities of political action about meat, the moral complexities of industrially-farming vegetables, the moral complexities of doing so many things so dependent on oil, the moral complexities of thinking of animals as community members, and so on. These are gripping, pressing issues. It is wonderful that there is a state-of-the-art collection that touches on them. Anyone interested in the topic should read it cover-to-cover.


Barnhill, Anne, Mark Budolfson, and Tyler Doggett, eds. Forthcoming-a. Food, Ethics, and Society: An Introductory Text with Readings. Oxford University Press.

Barnhill, Anne, Mark Budolfson, and Tyler Doggett, eds. Forthcoming-b. Oxford Handbook of Food Ethics. Oxford University Press.

Boisvert, Raymond and Lisa Heldke. 2016. Philosophers at Table. Reaktion.

Chignell, Andrew, Terence Cuneo, and Matthew C. Halteman, eds. 2015. Philosophy Comes to Dinner. Routledge.

Dieterle, J.M., ed. 2015. Just Food: Philosophy, Justice, and Food. Rowman and Littlefield.

Goodman, Charles. 2014. "Ethics in Indian and Tibetan Buddhism", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Kaplan, David, ed. 2012. The Philosophy of Food. University of California Press.

Sandler, Ronald. 2014. Food Ethics: The Basics. Routledge.

Schlottmann, Christopher and Jeff Sebo. Forthcoming. Food, Animals, and the Environment: An Ethical Approach. Routledge.

Thompson, Paul. 2015. From Field to Fork. Oxford University Press.

Thompson, Paul and David Kaplan, eds. 2014. Encyclopedia of Food and Agricultural Ethics. Dordrecht: Springer.

[1] See Boisvert and Heldke (2016), Chignell, Cuneo, and Halteman (2015), Dieterle (2015), Kaplan (2012), Sandler (2014), Thompson (2015), and Thompson and Kaplan (2014).

[2] For some work on the harm done by various sorts of food production, see essays by Mark Budolfson in Barnhill, et al. (Forthcoming-a) and (Forthcoming-b). For much on food production and the environment, see Schlottmann and Sebo (forthcoming).