The Moral Demands of Affluence

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Garrett Cullity, The Moral Demands of Affluence, Oxford University Press, 2004, 296pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199258112.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Brand-Ballard, George Washington University


How much money and time does morality oblige the relatively affluent to devote to the relief of poverty, suffering, and other disadvantages? Anyone who finds this question remotely important should read Garrett Cullity's meticulous, even-handed treatment.

The publication of this monograph signals the continuing emergence of a normative orientation that one might call "beneficence theory." Beneficence theorists study the moral demands of beneficence, and limits thereon. Major beneficence theorists include, in addition to Cullity, Peter Singer (1972), Shelly Kagan (1989), Peter Unger (1996), Liam Murphy (2000), and Tim Mulgan (2001). Some of these philosophers support forms of consequentialism. Others, including Cullity, assess the demands of beneficence without treating it as the only ultimate moral value.

Cullity's first six chapters comprise Part I, "Demands," in which he makes a powerful case for what he calls

The Extreme Demand

I am morally required to keep contributing time and money to aid agencies … until either: (a) there are no longer any lives to be saved … by those agencies, or (b) contributing my share of the cost of our collectively saving one further life … would itself be a large enough sacrifice to excuse my refusing to contribute. (pp. 78-9)

In making this case, Cullity raises and rebuts several lines of argument against the Demand. In Part II, "Limits," he then presents an original argument against the Demand and defends a more moderate thesis about the demands of affluence.

As beneficence theorists often do, Cullity starts with the intuitive force of the so-called life-saving analogy, first presented in Singer's (1972) classic. In Cullity's words, "if I were confronted directly by the great need of someone whom I could help at negligible cost to myself, it would certainly be wrong not to help. So unless being confronted directly makes a difference -- and why should it? -- the same should be said about giving money to aid agencies." (p. 10)

In Chapters 2 through 4, Cullity defends the life-saving analogy against important objections. These chapters are very well executed, but they mostly set the stage for the ambitious part of the book, so I summarize them very briefly. Chapter 2 rebuts attempts to block the analogy by drawing moral distinctions based on directness, immediacy, and particularity. Chapter 3 confronts and refutes, with a refreshing degree of candor and empirical documentation, the charge that global aid agencies do at least as much harm as good. Chapter 4 considers challenges to the analogy based on the fact that my personal contribution to a relief agency makes no perceptible difference to the life of any identifiable individual.

The first four chapters reach the conclusion that beneficence requires the affluent to do something for the destitute. The remainder of the book asks: how much? Chapter 5 introduces the choice that will occupy Cullity for the next three chapters: between iterative and aggregative approaches to the derivation of moral conclusions from the life-saving analogy. An iterative approach treats each additional threatened life as though it were the first, for the purpose of computing the extent of the affluent agent's moral duty. By contrast, an aggregative approach limits the agent's obligations by reference to the aggregate cost of her contributions so far.

The choice between iterative and aggregative approaches makes a great difference to the demandingness of beneficence. Cullity argues that an iterative approach supports the Extreme Demand. Although he will spend Part II challenging this Demand, and ultimately rejecting it, he first gives it the sort of hearing one would expect of a proponent. This is one of the distinctive and admirable aspects of the book. For example, he considers and rejects a category of aggregative approaches -- "Fair Share Views" -- defended recently by Liam Murphy (2000). Fair Share Views hold that, to compute "what each affluent individual is morally required to contribute to the collective action of helping the poor, we should divide the overall burden among all those on whom it falls." (pp. 73-4) Cullity argues that this intuitively appealing solution fails. The fact that so many affluent people have "defected" from the collective enterprise of beneficence does not relieve those of us who remain from the duty to form a new collective enterprise with similar goals, and to divide the remaining work fairly amongst ourselves. The relative scarcity of altruists just raises our "Fair Share" back to the Extreme Demand, Cullity concludes.

An intuitive case remains for some kind of aggregative approach, but Cullity finds that case ultimately unconvincing, as ignoring the separateness of persons. The intuitive case has me "lump together all of the people I could contribute to helping, and ask what I should be prepared to do for this collective entity." (p. 86) Cullity thinks this ignores "the reality of the individual need" of each needy person. The beneficent agent's reason to help a certain individual is simply "that he needs help," and the fact that one has helped others does not constitute a countervailing consideration against this reason. At the end of Chapter 5, Cullity concludes that a strong pro tanto case can be made for an iterative approach, supporting the Extreme Demand.

Chapter 6 considers and rejects several popular arguments against the Demand, including those of Kant and Bernard Williams. A satisfactory reply to the Extreme Demand, Cullity suggests, should show what is wrong with the iterative approach, allow morality (though not beneficence) to demand extreme self-sacrifice, accommodate supererogation, avoid egoism, and do all this without appealing to premises more controversial than its conclusion. (p. 107) These desiderata regulate Part II, in which Cullity presents his own argument against the Extreme Demand and his own moderate principle of beneficence.

The basis for Cullity's position appears in Chapters 7 and 8. His strategy, reminiscent of T.M. Scanlon (1998), argues that the Extreme Demand can be reasonably rejected from an appropriately impartial point of view. To show this, Cullity claims, is to undermine the argument of Part I. Cullity argues in Chapter 8 that the Demand can be rejected "from the point of view of beneficence itself." (p. 119) This is the argumentative core of the book and the most provocative chapter. The argument is ingenious, though I was not ultimately persuaded. It begins with the familiar premise that many of the intrinsically life-enhancing goods are "goods of partiality," such as friendship, personal projects, and community involvement. The Extreme Demand, however, would require me to lead an "altruistically-focused life" in which I "constrict[] my pursuit [of the goods of partiality] as much as I bearably and usefully can, for the purpose of contributing to helping others." (p. 133)

Happily, Cullity does not rehash the much-discussed "appeal to cost." (Kagan 1989; Scheffler 1982) Rather, he uses goods of partiality against the Extreme Demand in a bold and original way. First, he asks what reasons, exactly, the life-saving analogy assumes us to have. One reason concerns the interests of those whom we could rescue. Someone's interest in partial goods, for example, gives one reason to rescue her. However, Cullity asserts, someone's interest in something cannot give one reason to help her obtain it if it would be morally wrong for her to obtain it.

Now comes the critical step in Cullity's argument. The Extreme Demand, he observes, entails that one is wrong to live a life that is not "altruistically focused." If someone's interest in something cannot give us reason to help her obtain it if obtaining it would be morally wrong, the conclusion is that the interests a drowning man has in goods of partiality do not give anyone a reason to rescue him. However, Cullity contends, the life-saving analogy rests on the basic moral conviction that such interests do supply reasons to rescue. So, if the Extreme Demand is true, then that conviction is mistaken. Thus, the Demand, combined with the other aforementioned premises, undermines the life-saving analogy, and thereby itself.

Cullity's form of argument, which he calls an "internal approach," (p. 119) has many virtues. There is elegance and power in arguing that the judgments that motivate the Extreme Demand also undermine it. In Chapters 9 through 11, Cullity extends this argument into a defense of an aggregative approach, thereby reconciling the life-saving analogy with its own implications, as he has argued that the iterative approach cannot. He concludes that, not only may we do less than the Extreme Demand requires, we may do much less -- though still more than most of us do. Put crudely: we may pursue any good of sufficient importance that beneficence would obligate someone else to help us avoid its loss (e.g., goods of partiality). It is reasonable, Cullity argues, to maintain a personal policy that permits me to pursue such goods. This consideration countervails against the pro tanto reason to aid, without "appealing to what I have done for others to justify an unwillingness to contribute toward helping the next person." (p. 191)

Despite the power of his internal approach, I think Cullity rejects the Demand prematurely. He relies on the following principle:

When your interest in having (or doing) a certain thing is an interest in having (or doing) what it would be wrong for you to have (or do), that interest cannot be a good reason for morally requiring me to help you get (or do) it. (138, 140)

Cullity describes this principle as "widely recognized," citing eminent particularists and Kantians, (138, 253 nn.17, 18) as well as our intuitions. "If a gangster's gun jams," Cullity observes, "I ought not help him fix it." (138)

One might doubt, however, whether Cullity generalizes correctly from the gangster case. First, the gangster's aims are intrinsically wrong, unlike those of typical non-altruists. Secondly, whatever countervailing moral reasons (if any) might exist in favor of the gangster's aims, such reasons are much too weak to justify the latter. A more cautious generalization from our intuitions about the gangster case would include these qualifications (italicized):

When your interest in having (or doing) a certain thing is an interest in having (or doing) what it would be wrong, all-things-considered, for you to have (or do), that interest cannot be a good reason, all-things-considered, for morally requiring me to help you get (or do) it.

This principle leaves open the possibility that the specified interest could be a good pro tanto reason for morally requiring me to help you.

Suppose you accidentally drop a bag of diamonds in a river. I should help retrieve them, if I can easily do so. Cullity's view implies that it is your interest in possessing diamonds that gives me reason to help you. Now suppose it turns out you own some of the diamonds, but have stolen most of them. I can retrieve the entire bag of diamonds or none of them. Your interest in the diamonds you own still gives me a pro tanto reason to help you, but the fact that you stole most of the diamonds gives me a countervailing reason, presumably stronger, not to help you. Suppose it is wrong, all things considered, for me to help you. That conclusion does not imply that your interest in your own diamonds gives me no pro tanto reason to help you.

Cullity's position, however, requires the truth of at least one of the two following propositions. The first is that the Extreme Demand implies that goods of partiality provide no pro tanto moral reason to help. But the Demand does not imply this. It merely implies that the pro tanto reason provided by partial goods may not generate an all-things-considered reason to help, given sufficiently weighty countervailing reasons.

Alternatively, Cullity's argument could succeed if the fact that the pursuit of partial goods detracts from the collective project of beneficence constitutes a sufficiently weighty countervailing reason to override the pro tanto reason provided by those goods.

However, the fact that pursuit of partial goods detracts from beneficent projects does not constitute a sufficiently weighty countervailing reason. We can agree with Cullity that, according to the Extreme Demand, one should never promote partial goods at the expense of altruism. But the potential rescuer in the life-saving scenario has no option available to her that detracts from beneficent projects to any lesser degree than does the rescue. True, the victim is not as altruistic as she should be, according to the Demand, but failing to rescue her will not facilitate more altruism. So the rescuer is still obligated to rescue. The partial goods in which the victim is interested do not cease to provide pro tanto reasons to rescue her, and the countervailing reason lacks sufficient weight, in this scenario.

Compare the following variation, in which the relative inadequacy of a victim's altruism does supply a sufficient countervailing reason. Suppose I can rescue only one of two victims. Both will benefit equally from rescue, so I have equally strong pro tanto reasons to rescue each. Neither victim lives with an entirely altruistic focus, so I have a countervailing reason not to help either one. However, one victim leads a more altruistically-focused life than the other. This fact gives me a weaker countervailing reason not to help the first and a stronger countervailing reason not the help the second. All things considered, I should save the more altruistic victim (rather than saving neither, saving the less altruistic, or flipping a coin).

The most Cullity can conclude, I think, is that the Extreme Demand entails that more altruistic victims enjoy priority over less altruistic ones. If there are no more altruists available to rescue, then beneficence still requires me to rescue endangered non-altruists. The "wrongness" of the less altruistic victim's lifestyle does not neutralize his claim on me; it merely gives him lower priority than any more altruistic victim. The Demand entails that the victim has, in absolute terms, a weaker claim on us than we believed, pre-theoretically, but his relative claim on us remains as strong as ever. His claim is weaker than we imagined, but still no one makes a stronger claim. The sinking tide of rectitude lowers all boats.

We also learn from Cullity's argument that refusal to obey the Demand is not intrinsically wrong, in contrast to, say, sadistic action. We can allow that, from the beneficent point of view, the sadist's interest in sadistic pleasure does not give me even a pro tanto reason to help him find his lost whip. However, the fact that refusing to obey the Demand is not intrinsically wrong does not entail that refusal is permissible, all things considered. Refusal is impermissible, if Cullity's impressive Part I is correct.

Whatever one thinks of Part II, the appeal of the book resides equally in Part I. Many philosophers are attracted to the arguments which Cullity there dismantles. They will learn from him. By treating well-chosen opposing views so carefully and thoroughly, the book also rewards those who reject the author's ultimate conclusions. Cullity spends much time rebutting arguments for the moderate conclusions which he, himself, endorses, on other grounds. Indeed, because his critiques of other moderates are so strong, if readers remained unpersuaded by his ultimate solution, the book could have the ironic effect of leaving the moderate in a worse position than she enjoyed before it was published.

Thus, the book offers something for nearly everyone. Although many of the arguments are indirect and difficult, the chapters are well-organized and clearly written. An advanced undergraduate with an ethics background should be able to follow them, and will gain a sophisticated overview of this vital area.


Kagan, Shelly. (1989). The Limits of Morality (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Mulgan, Tim. (2001). The Demands of Consequentialism (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Murphy, Liam B. (2000). Moral Demands in Non-ideal Theory (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Scanlon, T.M. (1998). What We Owe to Each Other (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).

Scheffler, Samuel. (1982). The Rejection of Consequentialism. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Singer, Peter. (1972). "Famine, Affluence, and Morality." Philosophy & Public Affairs, 1, pp. 229-243.

Unger, Peter. (1996). Living High and Letting Die: Our Illusion of Innocence. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).