The Moral Demands of Memory

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Jeffrey Blustein, The Moral Demands of Memory, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 372pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521709729.

Reviewed by Sue Campbell, Dalhousie University


There has been extensive critical challenge by historiographers to the contemporary preoccupation with memory, in particular to the alleged tendency of groups to form collective identities based on historic grievance and to reparative responses to grievance that risk converting politics to memorializing. Jeffrey Blustein begins The Moral Demands of Memory with Nietzsche's challenge that happiness and effective agency require the robust capacity to forget the past, to feel unhistorically as well as historically in appropriate measure (6). Blustein replies with a thoughtful, passionate, complex series of arguments in defence of the claim that individuals and groups have extensive obligations to remember their pasts as both constitutive of and instrumental in taking responsibility for them. By reading Nietzsche's concern as one of balance, the charge of excessive remembering is absorbed into a virtue-oriented account (one also influenced by phenomenology, psychoanalysis, expressivism, and feminist moral psychology and social epistemology) where an appropriate measure of memory becomes primarily an issue not of whether but of how we engage the past. As collective engagement with the past is often demanded and at issue in cases of historic wrongdoing, the book, while one of the first systematic philosophical treatments of an ethics of memory, also makes a significant contribution to the literature on reparations, an area where memory theory has been a striking and regrettable absence. Moreover, the psychoanalytically inflected notion of taking responsibility at its core makes this impressive study a welcome addition to current thought on forward-looking responsibility, stressing agency and creativity over the grudging acceptance of duty.

The book's agenda is expansive. The two autobiographical anecdotes that frame the discussion -- the uneasy fading of Blustein's memory of his father and a companion's challenge to European preoccupation with the Holocaust (xi-xii) -- informally introduce the commitment to hold personal and collective memory independently and equally in view. The book is unified by a line of argument that reflects on connections amongst memory, identity, and responsibility, and also by a focus on the value of the moral and affectional attitudes of love, acknowledgement, caring, and respect that remembering can express, in balance with more consequentialist considerations.

The notion of responsible remembrance is centered through an account of individual and group identity formation where some obligations (including obligations of remembrance) are internally related to or partly constitutive of identities (46), helping make the identities a source of value and giving the obligations special weight. I found some of this argument difficult to follow. While the obligation to be observant might partly constitute a particular religious identity as a normative identity, it is difficult to track fully the reasoning to "obligations deriving from identity include obligations to remember aspects of one's past that are internally related to constitutive features of one's identity" (49). The terms of the purported internal relationship seem to have shifted (aspects of the past rather than duties of remembrance), and the example meant to clarify -- that Native Americans have an obligation to remember the past injustices that have shaped their identity -- doesn't sufficiently bear the weight of the argument. In one sense of a constituting past, when harm has severely compromised previous forms of group life and reshaped them through oppression and stigmatization, whether or how to identify with a group category may be a difficult and contested question. In another sense, how a past constitutes identity through that past's remembrance is, as Blustein stresses, appropriately fluid, dynamic, oriented towards effective future agency, and identity-reconfiguring. Precisely because of the role of memory in self-constitution, the relation of the past to who we are is never static, even while there are epistemic constraints on what counts as accurate memory or a credible self-narrative. Nevertheless, Blustein consistently qualifies his main claims, or has the resources to do so, and it is easy to concede that obligations to remember are often "entangled with identity" (49) and for that reason have normative weight -- they must be addressed even if they are not undertaken.

A related and more fully elaborated line of argument is that, for a variety of reasons, a kind of identity-entangling responsibility is often morally required: namely, taking responsibility for one's past through a type of remembering that reasonably appropriates the past to one's agency, action that inevitably reconstructs the past's meaning while reshaping identity. For individuals, events experienced as passively undergone may be newly remembered as the results of one's evaluations or decisions, founding agency by helping to forge and sustain a sense of self as historical, and founding effective moral agency through making possible the virtues of humility and self-forgiveness (Ch. 2). For (perpetrator) groups taking responsibility through memory for unredeemed historic wrongs converts the meaning of these harms to acknowledged wrongdoing (142-43). Such remembering is both necessary for any effective reparative action and, when expressed through appropriate public memorializing, can often itself constitute an important level of moral repair (166-67). Though the focus here is on wrong-doing groups, aggrieved groups are also charged with responsibilities (non-exaggeration of claims, for example) whose enactment can contribute to possibilities of collectively acknowledged wrong. Blustein thus works systematically and elegantly with an idea of appropriation that's been lurking since Locke to bring remembering into identity constitution with a moral force partly aimed at deflating concern about excess, but also, it should be noted, aimed at engaging reflection on the range of potential responsibilities (e.g. remembering the "dear departed"; being cautious about psycho-pharmocological solutions to a troubled past) that constitute the lives of ordinary rememberers.

While Blustein gives little attention to the cognitive dynamics of memory, the retrospective construction of meaning that characterizes appropriation consciously engages with constructivist themes in contemporary memory studies, including the skepticism about accurate memory that has preoccupied much of this literature. Blustein's observation that our ability to retrospectively give the past new significance is central to moral agency is a particularly important point to stress (40-41; 66-69). Blustein also argues that though memory is fragile -- we are prone to distort and forget the past -- it should be assumed compatible with the commitments to truth and accuracy necessary to take responsibility for the past if we think we can do so (102). I am sympathetic to these arguments from the nature of our moral capacities and the fact of their exercise; others may be less so. The book does not engage with empirical work on remembering, and does not enter specific debates that have challenged whether we capable of remembering well. But while other authors have distanced themselves from exaggerated tendencies to conceive construction in terms of distortion, as noted above Blustein puts his reconstructive thesis to the additionally important use of linking the retrospective construction of meaning to our capacity for effective reparative agency. This thread in his account might, if pressed, destabilize notions of group identity that seem to me somewhat overly fixed.

Though it is a key methodological choice to distinguish and analogize personal and collective memory (rather than blurring this distinction as some authors have), Blustein's capacity to move between them in a nuanced and mutually illuminating way while also attending to their interrelation is far more sophisticated than that of most memory theorists. Moreover the grounding location of post-Holocaust remembrance prevents a simplistic move from the individual to the collective as an individual writ large. Nevertheless, a likely cost of the methodology is Blustein's nearly exclusive focus on socially unified groups. Reasoning analogically from the discussion of how persons take responsibility for their identities leads to attention to groups that are sufficiently unified to enable talk of a shared self-conception. Groups become socially unified by members having properties in common and sharing a conception as group members based on this commonality (oddly homosexuals are offered as an example of such a group) (120-23). Moreover, to collectively act on obligations, groups must have a level of internal organization that can support the idea (Margaret Gilbert's, adapted for this account) of a "plural subject" (126). There is further momentum towards unification through Blustein's desire to offer an argument for reparations to successors different from the more common harm or inheritance arguments. A reason to make reparations to successors comes from "the meaning that a particular history possesses for those whose history it is" (162). Finally, while group unity is a point of departure for the analysis, taking responsibility seems to further stabilize group identities as perpetrators and victims as the former come to recognize more truly what their identity involves while the latter receive recognition that secures "for the current group an understanding of its history that supports a sense of its own worth and a dignified sense of its collective identity" (164). While many populations affected by reparative claims are not unified in the way Blustein describes (he rightly notes they may become more so in response to such claims), there is also little attention to the possibility of a positive disruption to group boundaries through sharing the past and the collective retrospection of its significance. Some First Nations leaders in Canada insist that we together come to remember the past so as to recognize our status -- indigenous and settler alike -- as treaty people. That is, they seek a kind of remembering that while not dissolving group boundaries, also helps initiate a specific shared level of group identification and reflection on its responsibilities. Many reparative initiatives share this characteristic, and, optimistically I grant, this kind of remembering can perhaps exemplify the creativity to taking responsibility that Blustein so effectively advocates.

On evidence of examples as well as more explicit remarks (see pp. 29-30, for example) post-Holocaust remembrance provides a primary reflective location for Blustein's approach to collective remembering. Critically indispensible as the location has been and is, readers may want to shift to a wider range of cases in thinking about the possibilities of reparative remembrance. Focus on indigenous/settler relations, for example, might also problematize the claims of Chapter 4, which positions history (governed by scientific methodology and expressed in writing) as disciplining and correcting the mythic tendencies of collective memory. The idea of truth in memory, in fact, becomes mediated by the commitment to truth in history:

collective memory does not entirely retreat from history, and therefore collective memory becomes vulnerable to correction by history. And because truth is the normative aim of history, collective memory is vulnerable to correction by truth about the past as well. (178)

An assessment of the force of the history/memory contrast needs itself to reflexively attend to that contrast's history, one in which rich practices of oral memory governed by complex ethical and epistemic norms have been positioned as primitive and archaic as an integral part of colonizing projects. It is also difficult to see why national myths don't equally inform history and memory, and why history and memory can't be equally and complexly corrective of distortion, especially given Blustein's positioning of both practices as interpretive and as independently governed by a range of ethical and epistemic norms as well as by social need. These challenges do nothing to question the value of Blustein's intense, intelligent reflections on the contributions that appropriate remembrance can make to reparations. No one in philosophy has attempted this kind of detailed and necessary contribution to the current conversation on moral repair.

Blustein's book is difficult to encapsulate and rewarding to engage. It is deeply indebted to a range of diverse literatures, carefully and extensively footnoted, and though the book is fairly long, it sustains an impressive momentum. Indeed the last two chapters -- on remembrance and rituals of memorializing as love, care, and respect for the dead, and on the nature and importance of bearing witness -- do a great deal to persuasively integrate personal with collective memory through reflection on the importance of communal practice as a response to memory's personal and political fragility. They also draw expansively on a range of philosophical frameworks to contribute new and genuine insight into how values, emotions, and critical attitudes of moral acknowledgement are expressively constituted through various modes of remembrance.

No individual past or group inheritance is untroubled by occasions for regret at least, and many histories are marked by the need to make repair to others and/or to receive recognition from others for their un-redeemed wrongs. Though in the end Blustein concedes little to the ethical value of an unhistorical orientation to the world, he does show how much an historical orientation can be one of full-hearted and forward-looking moral agency.