The Moral Equality of Humans and Animals

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Mark H. Bernstein, The Moral Equality of Humans and Animals, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 153pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230276628.

Reviewed by Bernard Rollin, Colorado State University


One of the greatest values inherent in philosophical activity is that it forces a reconsideration of many of the assumptions that we accept as axiomatic and take for granted. This is true throughout the history of philosophy: Parmenides (and his disciple Zeno) forced us to realize that we thoroughly did not understand the nature of motion by raising questions that remain in some senses still problematic today. Descartes (and his mentor, Plato) forced us, as against common sense, to question the degree to which sense experience provides a reliable basis for knowledge. Hume showed us that even our knowledge of the self could not be coherently explicated. And such forced re-examination of our assumptions is at least as operative in ethics as it is in metaphysics. In ethics, this process has had innumerable salubrious consequences for society. Massive amounts of non-rationally justifiable forms of exclusion and discrimination directed against other human beings have been rejected after being shown to be morally indefensible.

Animal ethics, with some historical exceptions (some going back to antiquity), is largely a product of the second half of the twentieth century. We may distinguish even within this short time a variety of approaches. The earliest attempts -- i.e. Peter Singer, Tom Regan, myself, Steve Sapontzis -- were primarily designed to show that animals deserve inclusion within the moral arena far beyond the traditional Thomistic injunction of avoiding cruelty to them. Various strategies were designed to achieve this result -- utilitarian, Kantian, or in my case, extraction of animal ethics from our social consensus ethic for humans. In the course of our work on moral status for animals, we were inevitably drawn to criticizing current uses. Here there occurred a bifurcation: some philosophers argued for the total abolition of invasive animal use. I in turn believed, along with the great radical activist Henry Spira, that all social revolutions in the history of the United States had proceeded incrementally, and thus was inclined to work towards improving current practices.

Mark H. Bernstein has from the outset been a radical abolitionist. Now that most philosophers believe that animals are deserving of significant moral status, philosophers have engaged in looking at some of the more detailed questions that inevitably arise from this augmented status. Bernstein takes as his task two major questions: are animal interests less important than human interests and are animal lives worth less than human lives. If he succeeds in demonstrating that animal interests are no less important than human interests and that animal lives are not worth less than human lives, he has gone a long way towards proving that all of the invasive uses upon which current human life depends -- be they for food and fiber, scientific discovery and advancement, or entertainment -- are patently unjustifiable and indefensible.

Roughly the first third of the book is dedicated to the comparative importance of animal interests versus human interests. In a lively and dialectical way, Bernstein examines some of the stock reasons offered in support of the thesis that human interests are morally superior and thus deserve preferential consideration and prioritization in the actions of moral agents. He distinguishes three views of interests: "mental state or experientialist theories;" "desire or preference theories;" and "perfectionist or objective list theories." Satisfaction or thwarting of interests is constitutive of welfare. His discussion aims at being valid regardless of which view of interests is considered.

Bernstein goes on to consider some of the reasons that have been advanced to support the claim that human interests are of greater concern than those of other beings. After dismissing primitivism, i.e. the belief that it is just a fact about the universe that human interests are of greater concern, as arbitrary, he examines reasons that might allegedly ground primitivism, for example the claim that rationality is only instantiated in humans. Aside from the fact that we do not morally favor humans who have a higher degree of rationality than others, Bernstein points out that it is not the mere capacity that should bestow higher status, but rather its actualization. A being who fails to actualize a capacity is no different from a being lacking that capacity. Further, he argues that belonging to a certain species or kind is not something we are responsible for, or choose; rather it is as if it were bestowed upon us, as a gift from God, and thus we deserve no credit for being of that sort. He sees the situation as very much analogous to being born female or possessed of black skin; nothing in these traits makes us blameworthy and therefore entitled to negative differential treatment of the sort traditionally accorded to those classes.

To the claim that we are naturally disposed to favor those of our own species, Bernstein accurately points out that such a presupposition does not make the behavior morally correct. We may well be biologically disposed towards xenophobia -- that does not in itself morally justify xenophobia. Furthermore, membership in a species does not reside in a rationally chosen sense of common, noble purpose; such membership is more a biological accident than it is constitutive of a laudable gemeinschaft supporting such a purpose. To use a metaphor from chemistry, common membership in the species is more like a mixture than a compound.

To be fair, I have greatly truncated Bernstein's arguments to the point where much of both the flavor and subtlety of his discussion has essentially been lost. This is of course an unfortunate consequence of a brief review. Suffice it to say that he does a far better job than is captured in my discussion. But what is most important is that he makes us take pause and carefully re-examine our prejudices in favor of human interests. What emerges loud and clear from his analysis is the arbitrariness of assuming that human interests are inherently superior sub specie aeternitatis. We are left wondering to what extent giving pride of place to human interests is conceptually nothing more, to paraphrase Nietzsche, than turning our biases and hang-ups into a metaphysic.

The majority of the book is devoted to an equally careful examination of the belief that human life is inherently more valuable than the lives of other animals, an assumption even more ubiquitous than the belief in the primacy of human interests. While it is not comparatively that difficult to accept Bernstein's argument about interests, the affirmation that animal lives are no less valuable than human lives is extremely counterintuitive. Much in the way that the early philosophers of animal ethics challenged those who would deny animals inclusion in the moral arena asked for the morally relevant characteristic that serves to exclude animals, Bernstein challenges us to specify the characteristic that makes human lives more valuable than animal.

One of the most common arguments in this regard is the claim that animals live more or less in the moment, while human lives are inherently tied up with futural possibilities and plans. It is often argued that killing a person makes a mockery of much of their activities. We study hard not for its own sake, but in order to get accepted into medical school, which in turn derives its value from the future possibilities intrinsic to treating patients. An animal, on the other hand, lacking language and the attendant syntax that allows humans to transcend the current moment, has no such future plans, and thus death is not the misfortune for animals that it is for people. For this reason, human life is of greater significance than animal life. Humans lose more than animals do when their lives are cut short.

It is certainly difficult to deny the distinction between human cognition and animal cognition inherent in the capacity of humans to project into the future. What Bernstein calls into question is whether this difference in fact marks the morally relevant difference between the respective values of human versus animal life. What, for example, prevents one from arguing that a life without future plans that can be thwarted and arbitrarily rendered meaningless by untimely death is more morally valuable than a life that is totally self-contained at each moment. From a subjective perspective, for example, the pleasure of human life must of necessity be constrained and tempered by the omnipresent possibility of death and lesser things that can go wrong. For an animal however, this is not a concern, as the animal lacks, in Heidegger's excellent phrasing, the capacity to "understand and think about the possibility of the impossibility of its being," or adventitious negative possibilities. Why, in other words, is not a life unsullied by deep anxieties about the future not a more valuable life than one that is so tainted? And further, why can one not argue that the animal life is thus in one sense a more, rather than less, perfect life? Just because humans lose more than animals do by virtue of a truncated life, it does not follow that human lives are objectively more valuable. Also, what if the future plans of a human are dedicated to the promotion of thoroughgoing evil? Is such a life more valuable simply by virtue of its formal structure?

A significant question we alluded to earlier is occasioned by Bernstein's argument. He affirms that we do not value the lives of individual humans with highly complex plans (or intellects) more than those individuals whose aspirations are far more simplistic. In Bernstein's words "We don't believe that Einstein's pain deserves preferential consideration". I am not at all sure that such is the case but do not have the opportunity to construct the counterargument here.

Clearly, Bernstein's discussion raises the well-known issue enunciated by John Stuart Mill. Mill affirms famously (and inconsistently) that, the key feature in ethical deliberation is the amount of pleasure (and pain) a given action generates. The more pleasure and the least amount of pain generated, the more morally valuable the action. But Mill also goes on to argue that there are "higher" and "lower" pleasures such that a lesser amount of a higher pleasure (for example, reading philosophy) is more valuable than a great amount of a lower pleasure (such as guzzling beer), thereby committing him to the view that there are things more valuable than just pleasure. Since animals are incapable of the so-called "higher pleasures," animal life may be said to be of lower value. His discussion of this thesis is quite astute.

Mill's argument in support of this claim involves in part an appeal to the opinions of those who experience both higher and lower pleasures. It is by no means clear to me, or to common sense, that such people will invariably choose the higher pleasure. Many people, even philosophers, may well be inclined to choose beer-guzzling!

Bernstein is an extremely clear and engaging writer. In particular, he tends to avoid the sort of philosophical jargon that is prohibitive for ordinary people even when they possess great interest in the issues addressed. Another stylistic advantage is represented by his making the same point in multiple ways and by using colorful and fanciful anecdotes as illustrative. My major complaint concerning his writing style is his tendency to use rather random abbreviations to stand for arguments he has developed at length. These are numerous and annoying, as I find myself constantly needing to go back in the text to interpret such shorthand as CI, VL, HST,CIS, VLS, CII,CIT and a plethora of others. He is a good enough writer that he could simply allude to the argument in question and not impede readability.

Although some of Bernstein's conclusions tend to be highly irritating to common sense and well-established moral intuitions, the reader will very likely find himself or herself drawn into the argument, muttering things like "I never thought of that," or "He seems to have a point here!" While I doubt that most readers will wholeheartedly accept Bernstein's conclusions, they will most assuredly be led to rethink and re-examine some of the things they have historically taken for granted. And this is what good philosophy should do.