The Moral Fool: A Case for Amorality

Placeholder book cover

Hans-Georg Moeller, The Moral Fool: A Case for Amorality, Columbia UP, 2009, 201pp., $24.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231145091.

Reviewed by Michael R. Slater, Georgetown University



In this short, provocative book, Hans-Georg Moeller develops a critique of morality from an amoralist perspective. Moeller, a specialist in Chinese and comparative philosophy and the social systems theory of the German sociologist Niklas Luhmann, has previously published books on Daoism and Luhmann, and this book reads largely as a commentary on and application of certain Daoist and Luhmannian views. Although this is a book on the subject of morality written by a professional philosopher, it does not appear to have been written primarily for professional philosophers, much less for specialists in ethics. With one notable exception, it deals with no literature in ethics written in the last hundred years, and neglects to discuss any of the contemporary literature in such fields as metaethics, moral theory, and moral psychology. While the author builds much of his case for amoralism on his reading of classical Daoist texts such as the Zhuangzi, he does not discuss any of the major literature on Daoist ethics, including the work of scholars who have defended interpretations that are similar or opposed to his own. The intended audience of the book is rather unclear, but it seems to be aimed primarily at a general readership. Specialists in the various fields that the book touches upon are likely to find it disappointing, both for its neglect of most of the relevant literature in these fields and for its overall failure to substantiate its major claims.

Moeller offers a defense of amoralism, the position of “the moral fool” (p. 4), a figure that Moeller derives from his study of classical Daoism (p. 15). On Moeller’s view, the moral fool is a person who rejects a moral perspective altogether, including such things as moral judgments, values, actions, principles, and virtues. One of the most concise statements of Moeller’s purpose in the book comes in the Introduction:

What I argue here is that one cannot say that morality is good or evil. Similarly, one cannot say that an ax or a gun is good or evil. I question the fundamental validity of such general ethical judgments. But my argument is not merely nihilistic. I also suggest that morality — or ethics — can be dangerous and that it may be advisable to be cautious with it. I say this because this idea is so often overlooked. In my profession, academic philosophy, interest in ethics has been, as in society on the whole, very much on the rise in recent years. If you want a job as a philosophy professor it is, nowadays, best to specialize in ethics … Ethics are in vogue. Politics and the mass media are all concerned with ethics. Even the economy is nowadays supposed to consider ethical questions. And in every case it is presupposed that ethics are ethically good (p. 2)

As Moeller explains, his “agnostic” position on morality — that of “the moral fool” — holds that “we cannot ultimately know if ethics are good or bad” (p. 4). He continues:

The moral fool simply does not understand why ethics are necessarily good. He does not know if the moral perspective is good at all. This does not mean that he is entirely without ethical judgments. The moral fool is not so different, I assert, from most people much of the time. Most of the time we neither think nor speak in ethical terms at all, and even when we do, we are often not entirely sure what exactly is, and what is not, ethical (p. 5).

These passages are worth citing at length, not only because they capture basic features of his position, but also because they are representative of Moeller’s approach and philosophical style. Although Moeller often states that he will make arguments in support of his position, he rarely does. Instead, he tends to make one unsupported or poorly supported assertion after another, and rarely bothers to provide evidence — whether textual or empirical — when it is needed to support them.

Moeller variously describes the moral fool as someone who “does not understand why ethics are necessarily good” (p. 5); as someone who “does not know if the moral perspective is good at all” (p. 5); as someone who thinks that ethical distinctions are dangerous (p. 2, p. 5); as someone who holds that “one cannot say that morality is good or evil” (p. 2); as someone who questions “the fundamental validity … of general ethical judgments” (p. 2); and as someone who does not believe “in inherent goodness or badness” (p. 2). As best I can tell, Moeller’s conception of amoralism entails the following philosophical views and claims:

1. Moral anti-realism (denies that there are moral facts, or that moral judgments can be true or false; see pp. 2-5, p. 35, for example).

2. Moral skepticism or agnosticism (denies the possibility of moral knowledge; see pp. 4-5, p. 52, for example).

3. Moral nihilism (denies the value of morality as such, as well as the validity of moral judgments; see p. 2, pp. 14-15, and p. 30, for example).

4. Moral suspicionism (morality is potentially — and tends to be — dangerous, and is not necessary, desirable, or helpful; this claim is repeatedly made throughout the book).

5. Morality is redundant, and can be replaced without loss by love in intimate relationships and by law in non-intimate relationships (see pp. 8-14, 43-52, for example).

Although Moeller sees some important affinities between his conception of amoralism and the ethical views of such philosophers as Nietzsche and Wittgenstein, he does little to justify his view. Moreover, he seems to be either unfamiliar with or uninterested in discussing the literature in ethics on amoralism and related topics such as emotivism, immoralism, and moral relativism. Given his particular set of interests, it is both surprising and unfortunate that Moeller did not engage the work of David Wong, who has written extensively on relativism and early Daoism. (Moeller does, however, take pains to distinguish his version of amoralism from both immoralism and moral relativism; see p. 28 and p. 190, note 6 in the first regard, and pp. 14-15 and 30-32 in the latter.) We learn in an endnote, for example, that the book is “highly influenced by the criticisms of morality found throughout Nietzsche’s whole oeuvre” (p. 190, note 6), and yet Nietzsche is mentioned in the book only twice in passing and once more in a brief endnote. Given this, and taking into account that Moeller wants to distinguish his defense of amoralism from Nietzsche’s immoralism (p. 28; p. 190, note 6), one would expect to see more attention devoted to this issue, as well as substantial engagement with Nietzsche’s works and the literature on Nietzsche’s views on morality. Unfortunately, none of this is forthcoming. Moeller mentions Wittgenstein on seven different occasions in the context of either explaining or defending his amoralism, which is curious at best. The only text of Wittgenstein’s that is ever referenced is “Wittgenstein’s Lecture on Ethics” (Philosophical Review 74 1965, 3-12), which the author does not discuss in much detail. Why Moeller chose not to include a chapter on Nietzsche, and why he chose not to develop and justify his unusual, amoralist interpretation of Wittgenstein’s ethical views at greater length are two of the more puzzling features of the book.

It is noteworthy that Moeller does not believe he is advancing a particularly novel conception or defense of amoralism, and indeed he claims to derive his position “on the whole” from Daoist philosophy, Zen Buddhism, Niklas Luhmann, and the British writer John Gray (pp. 4-5). A discussion of these influences on Moeller’s position takes us into the heart of his book, and so I turn now to chapter summaries.

Chapter 1, “The Moral Fool,” outlines Moeller’s concept of the moral fool, which he derives from his reading of classical Daoism and with which he finds parallels in the work of Nietzsche and Luhmann. Specifically, Moeller derives his concept of the moral fool from his reading of an early Daoist story (pp. 19-20). (The story that he paraphrases — without any reference — is contained in chapter 18 of the Huainanzi, and has been discussed in a similar connection by other scholars in the field of Chinese philosophy, most notably Lee Yearley, whose work is also not referenced.) We learn here that the moral fool is “blind with respect to moral judgments” (p. 20) and that he mistrusts “the goodness of distinguishing between good and bad — particularly when it comes to morality and ethics” (p. 20).

Chapter 2, “Negative Ethics,” builds upon the first chapter and offers an amoralist interpretation of the Zhuangzi. Moeller’s aim here is actually twofold: to offer the above-mentioned interpretation of the Zhuangzi, and to express his general agreement with the amoralist view that he finds there. Specialists in Chinese philosophy may find this chapter of the book vexing, since Moeller provides little textual and no commentarial support for his interpretation, and does not refer to any of the contemporary philosophical literature on this important Daoist text (which not only includes the work of scholars who would dispute many of Moeller’s claims, such as Robert E. Allinson and Philip J. Ivanhoe, but also the work of scholars who have advanced similar interpretations, such as Robert Eno, Chad Hansen, and Lee Yearley). At the end of the chapter, Moeller briefly discusses the amoralist views of John Gray, and concludes by claiming that Gray’s views are “as close as one can get to the negative ethics of the Daoist moral fool in contemporary theory” (p. 39).

Chapter 3, “The Redundancy of Ethics,” is the first of several chapters that deal with the fifth aspect of Moeller’s amoralism that I mentioned above, which for the sake of convenience we might term his redundancy thesis. (Actually, the thesis does not appear to be Moeller’s own, but rather that of Niklas Luhmann, which Moeller accepts with few if any apparent modifications.) Moeller’s view, in brief, is that morality is not typically a part of the fabric of everyday life (p. 43), and can be replaced without loss by love in intimate relationships and by law in non-intimate relationships; indeed, Moeller terms these "the two most important antidotes of [sic] morality" (p. 47), and he conceives of both in essentially non-moral terms. Morality, or ethics, on Moeller’s view, simply concerns moral dilemmas, but these rarely occur in everyday life and can be more effectively dealt with through non-moral means — i.e., through love and law (p. 43, pp. 47-52).

Chapter 4, “The Morality of Anger,” discusses two different ways of overcoming “righteous anger,” the sort of anger one feels when one has been, or believes that one has been, wronged. As Moeller writes, “either the evil person is finally brought to justice or one ceases to conceive of the evildoer in moral terms” (p. 54). As might be expected, Moeller is critical of the first way, which he terms the moral solution to anger, and advocates the second, which he terms the amoral solution (p. 54). The main problem with the first solution on his view is that “it is more likely, and easier to find, in fiction than in reality,” whereas the main problem with the second is that “it is very hard to forget what is felt so strongly” (p. 54). Moeller sees the political philosopher Walter Berns and Aristotle as examples of the first solution — both, on his view, defend a “morality of anger” — and Zen Buddhism as an example of the latter. (Oddly, Moeller only takes into account Aristotle’s discussion of anger in the Rhetoric, and does not consider his ethical analysis of anger as a vice in Book IV, Ch. 5 of the Nicomachean Ethics.) Although Moeller acknowledges that overcoming the emotion of anger can be difficult, he does not discuss how or to what extent this is possible. Indeed, following Owen Flanagan, one might ask whether Moeller’s view satisfies the Principle of Minimal Psychological Realism.1 Perhaps it can, but Moeller does not provide any evidence to show that it does. Another, quite serious problem facing Moeller’s defense of the amoral solution to anger is that it is largely based on a questionable amoralist interpretation of Zen Buddhist ethics, which ignores aspects of Zen Buddhism (as well as works of secondary literature) that fail to fit his interpretation.2

Chapter 5, “Ethics and Aesthetics,” makes a case for separating morality and aesthetics in how we judge works of art, and specifically takes issue with Richard Rorty’s views on the relationship between literature and democracy. As elsewhere in the book, Moeller makes a number of provocative but unsupported assertions, such as that “the incompatibility of ethical and aesthetic perceptions is rather obvious with respect to artifacts and visual arts or music” (p. 66) and that “the moral focus of a novel is, in my mind, not a significant criterion for its aesthetic, social, or cultural evaluation” (p. 69). In general, this chapter expresses Moeller’s skepticism of the view that art can make a valuable contribution to moral self-cultivation and social improvement. As Moeller sums up his view,

I dare to contradict Richard Rorty’s claim that literature (as well as philosophy) is, or should or could be, ethically educational and thus contribute pragmatically to promoting morality within a society. I think that aesthetics and ethics are, in most cases, quite distinct from one another (p. 74).

Chapter 6, “The Presumptions of Philosophical Ethics,” offers a breathtakingly terse critique of the entire field of ethics in philosophy. In twelve pages, Moeller undertakes to show that ethics is an abject failure because there is still no widely agreed upon normative ethical theory, which undermines the scientific pretensions of moral philosophers. Much of this chapter is devoted to revealing the shortcomings of Kant’s and Bentham’s ethical views, which are taken as being representative of Western ethics in general. As Moeller sums up his critique:

Modern Western ethics set out to rationally determine what is good or the conditions for what is to be considered good. Many different answers have been given. Still, I think that one does not need to look far to see that the project has been a grotesque disappointment. The epistemological optimism regarding the possibility of constructing a universally valid ethics proved to be unwarranted. Empirically speaking, Luhmann says, academic ethics have failed. I agree (p. 78).

Chapter 7, “The Myth of Moral Progress,” presents Moeller’s doubts regarding the actuality and possibility of moral progress in human societies, as well as his skepticism of the notion of human moral development. In the former regard, Moeller criticizes the widely held belief that there has been moral progress over the last few centuries concerning such practices as slavery and the subjugation of women (we tend to believe this, Moeller thinks, because we have undergone the equivalent of a Kuhnian paradigm shift — but moral progress is a myth, not an objective fact; see pp. 90-91, p. 103). In the latter regard, Moeller discusses the work of Lawrence Kohlberg, which he finds to be seriously flawed (no other work on the subject is discussed), and states his own amoralist view, which is as follows:

I do not see why a moral outlook and a moral life is necessarily better and more desirable than an amoral one. Even if people do become more moral as they age — or as I maintain, better qualified to communicate in moral terms — I would still not call this progress (p. 102).

Chapter 8, “For the Separation of Morality and Law,” asserts the view that “laws and the legal system not only have the capacity to function amorally, but … already do, at least to a certain extent,” and that “this is not detrimental, but rather a part of their evolutionary development” (p. 107). Moeller’s claims in this chapter appear to be almost entirely derived from the work of Niklas Luhmann, and indeed the chapter reads largely as an exposition of Luhmann’s views on this subject. John Rawls and Martha Nussbaum are both singled out as examples of philosophers who problematically think that notions such as fairness and human rights have (or ought to have) a moral basis.

Chapter 9, “Morality and Civil Rights,” extends the thesis of the previous chapter and aims to show that while morality may have played an important historic role in advancing civil rights, “ethics are no longer needed to fight for rights” (p. 121). As Moeller sums up his view, “I do not think that issues about war, voting rights, the treatment of ethnic or sexual minorities, or the environment are fundamentally moral issues nor do I think that an ethical approach is very effective in dealing with them” (pp. 125-26).

Chapter 10, “How to Get a Death Verdict,” undertakes to show that the death penalty can be opposed on amoral grounds, and that the rationale for the death penalty itself is largely based on a retributionist “morality of anger.” What Moeller fails to show, however, is that “morality is not the solution to this pseudolegal practice of the death penalty, but, on the contrary, is itself at the heart of the problem” (p. 132). Given that most people who oppose the death penalty do so for moral reasons, it would have helped Moeller’s case if had either made an argument for or provided evidence in support of this claim.

Chapter 11, “Masters of War,” and Chapter 12, “Ethics and the Mass Media,” offer, respectively, an amoralist critique of just war theory in general and the work of Michael Walzer in particular, and an exposition and endorsement of Niklas Luhmann’s views on “virtual morality.” Moeller’s discussion of Walzer’s views is both uncharitable and highly superficial. Furthermore, two of his central claims, that just war theory is "typically applied as a rhetorical device, as a rhetorical weapon, in war" (p. 162), and that just war theory is “more or less inescapably, part of the war machine” (p. 162) are not only unjustified but also demonstrably untrue, as evidenced by the fact that virtually all contemporary just war theorists have condemned the war in Iraq in accordance with just war principles. What Moeller tries to show in Chapter 12, in turn, is that — following Luhmann — all that we know about morality today (in Luhmann’s sense of “things that are ‘known to be known about’”) is learned through the mass media (pp. 172-73). I do not have space to discuss Moeller’s various reasons for holding this view (which seem to amount to his agreement with Luhmann), but should note his conclusion, which is that "the mass media do not control morality, they proliferate it — and they are inherently amoral themselves" (p. 182). As Moeller explains, “while [the mass media] flood society daily with moral discourse on a massive scale, they also constantly undermine the credibility of this very discourse” (p. 183). Hence, while Moeller is critical of the media’s role in proliferating “moral discourse,” as a moral fool he takes delight in the “carnivalistic” spectacle that it makes of morality (pp. 182-83).

In the Conclusion of The Moral Fool, Moeller acknowledges that “it is probably neither possible nor desirable to be a complete moral fool as envisioned by some Daoists” (p. 187). He continues:

But I think it is quite possible, natural, and healthy to be an imperfect one, someone who, most of the time, does not really believe that she knows what is really good or bad, and who does not even use such terms in an absolute sense (p. 187).

This is a revealing concession, and one wishes that Moeller had spent more time examining why it might be neither possible nor desirable for a normally constituted, adult human being to be a complete moral fool — that is, to reject a moral point of view altogether.

1 See Owen Flanagan, Varieties of Moral Personality: Ethics and Psychological Realism (Harvard UP, 1991), pp. 32-55.

2 For an example of an ethical interpretation of Zen Buddhist ethics, see Peter Harvey, An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics (Cambridge UP, 2000), pp. 143-45.