The Moral Foundations of Parenthood

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Joseph Millum, The Moral Foundations of Parenthood, Oxford University Press, 2018, 158 pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780190695439.

Reviewed by Liezl van Zyl, University of Waikato


In this book, Joseph Millum takes on the task of developing a coherent and unified theory of moral parenthood: How do we acquire parental rights and responsibilities? What do these rights and responsibilities consist in? And what are their limits? This is a notoriously difficult task. A theory of moral parenthood must accommodate our intuitions in standard cases of parenthood, while also offering guidance in non-standard or controversial cases, such as gamete donation, adoption, surrogate motherhood, and accidental fatherhood (i.e., where a man fathers a child despite using contraception). It must also account for the fact that parenthood is one of the greatest goods, a source of happiness and fulfilment, but also a burden, one that many people actively seek to avoid. Some people become parents with relative ease or even accidentally or unintentionally, whereas others must make a huge effort. Parents tend to feel a sense of entitlement over a child they see as belonging to them in some sense, but must also acknowledge the child as a human being with rights and interests that are independent of their own.

Given these (and many other) complexities, it is perhaps not surprising that most existing accounts of moral parenthood have serious shortcomings. For instance, theories that base parental rights in genetic relationship (see e.g. Hall 1999) cannot account for our intuition that gamete donors and absentee biological fathers don't have parental claims, whereas recipients of donated gametes and adoptive parents do. Labour-based accounts (see e.g. Gheaus 2012) can explain why some people deserve parental rights, regardless of whether they also have a genetic link to the child, but struggle to show how men can become parents (or at least equal parents). Finally, theories that base parenthood in voluntary or intentional action (see e.g. Hill 1991) give plausible results in cases of surrogate motherhood and gamete donation, but cannot account for our intuition that one can accidentally or involuntarily acquire parental rights and/or responsibilities. Of course, supporters of each of these theories can just insist on accepting what many consider counterintuitive or implausible. An alternative strategy, and one that I find more reasonable, is to give up the attempt to base parental rights and duties in a single concept or principle.

This is the strategy Millum adopts. His theory of moral parenthood has four parts. (1) Parental rights are based in desert: they have their origin in parental work, that is, work directed at the flourishing of a child. (2) The content of some of these rights is grounded in the interests of children, whereas the content of others is grounded in the interests of parents. (3) Parental responsibilities arise through certain voluntary actions that gain their significance from social convention. (4) Their content is determined by children's justice-based claims. Millum faces two important challenges when it comes to defending his theory. The first is to show that it is more successful than competing theories in accommodating our considered intuitions about parenthood. The second is to show that the theory is unified and coherent, despite drawing on a number of different values and principles. In my opinion, Millum meets both of these challenges. In what follows I highlight some of the central aspects of the theory, and indicate the advantages it has over existing theories.

Millum develops what he calls the "investment theory" of the acquisition of parental rights in Chapter 2. The theory is based in a more general principle of desert: parental rights are generated by the performance of parental work, and parental work includes any work directed at the flourishing of the child, such as preconception work, gestational care, and childcare. A troubling implication of this is that IVF technicians, medical professionals, gamete donors, surrogate mothers, and hired caregivers all seem to have a claim to moral parenthood, but Millum tries to avoid this problem by arguing that these people have implicitly or explicitly entered an agreement which stipulates that they are performing parental work on behalf of others. In the case of surrogacy, for example, and assuming that the parties entered a valid agreement, the surrogate is working on behalf of the contracting parents, with the implication that they have the strongest claim to parent the child in the event of a dispute.

Millum acknowledges that the investment theory has implications that some people might find counterintuitive, but he gives good reasons for accepting these. One such implication is that more than two people can parent a particular child, and that the parents need not comprise a man and a woman. Here, Millum's definition of parental work in terms of the flourishing of the child allows him to come to the conclusion that any parental set-up or way of raising children that leads them healthily through their development counts as a legitimate mode of parenting. This -- appropriately so -- puts the onus on opponents of novel or non-nuclear family arrangements to show that these arrangements are detrimental to children's flourishing. Another implication is that the gestational mother will generally have a massive majority stake in the child compared to genetic fathers (and everyone else, for that matter), and will therefore have the power to decide who else will get the opportunity to do parental work and hence to acquire parental rights. Supplying genetic material counts for very little, as it usually involves a minimal amount of work and is also the kind of work that one can perform on behalf of others. Millum accepts that many people have a strong preference for biological children, which he explains in terms of evolutionary biology, but he argues that these preferences do not entail rights over their objects. Hence, absent biological fathers who have invested no parental work into their offspring do not have any parental rights over them (although he goes on to argue later that they can have responsibilities towards the children they beget).

Millum turns his attention to the content of parental rights in Chapter 3. Traditional theories of parental rights tend to view them as (or as analogous to) property rights. These theories face an obvious problem: children are human beings with rights and interests of their own. Child-based accounts, in turn, encounter the problem of redistribution: If parental rights are grounded in the interests of children, then it seems to follow that children should be redistributed at birth to the best prospective parents (see Brighouse and Swift, 2006). Millum's investment theory (that parental rights are generated by the performance of parental work, which is any work directed at the flourishing of the child) has a rather attractive implication: some parental rights are fundamental in that they are derived from the interests of parents, and some parental rights are derivative, that is, grounded in the interests of children. The latter set includes rights not to be interfered with in the performance of parental responsibilities, as well as rights exercised on behalf of the child. Millum argues that their content depends on the child's needs and the ways a society organizes child-rearing. For instance, children have an interest in being educated, but whether -- and the extent to which -- parents have the right to make decisions about their child's education will depend on the education system in the society in question. In some societies children's educational needs are best served by allowing representatives of the state to make these decisions, but in societies where education involves learning a craft or skill parents may be best placed to exercise these rights.

Millum avoids the problem of redistribution by arguing that some parental rights are fundamental (grounded in the interests of the rights-bearer). Parents deserve the opportunity to enjoy the goods that their work has made possible (these being a flourishing child and a parent-child relationship). However, he argues that children's rights and parental responsibilities place constraints on parental rights. For instance, parents cannot appeal to their right to religious freedom to prevent their child from participating in activities that serve the interests of that child, such as getting educated about contraception. Similarly, corporal punishment is only permissible if it serves the interests of the child and if there are no other acceptable alternatives that do not violate the child's bodily integrity. Of course, many parents might want to argue that corporal punishment does benefit their child, and that they are in the best position to determine their best interests. Millum cites compelling evidence that shows that corporal punishment is contrary to children's interests, but this is one place where I thought an objective account of flourishing or well-being will strengthen his argument.

In Chapter 4 Millum develops an account of the origin of parental responsibilities. He begins by focusing on the problem of accidental fathers. Special responsibilities are generally thought to arise through voluntary action, but holding men responsible for the children they father accidentally seems unfair and disproportional if they have done everything they are expected to do to avoid such an outcome (apart from avoiding sexual intercourse altogether, that is). The alternative is to base parental responsibilities in genetics, but this creates a problem in the case of gamete donors. Millum considers various other alternatives but in the end settles on what he calls a "conventional-acts" account: parental duties are artificial in that they can acquired only because of established social conventions. Certain intentional actions, such as giving birth, having sexual relations, or signing adoption papers, give rise to parental responsibilities because they are understood to constitute taking on such responsibilities in a given society or culture. One implication of this view is that gamete donors do not transfer parental responsibilities to the recipients, given that the established convention in most societies is that donors do not have such responsibilities in the first place. It also means that we can criticize societal conventions as unfair, discriminatory, contrary the best interests of children, etc. and work towards changing these conventions. What we cannot do, Millum argues, is appeal to an account of natural duties, such as the claim that parental rights arise as a result of causing the existence of a person with unfulfilled needs.

Chapter 5 gives an account of the content of parental responsibilities in terms of children's justice-based claims. In this view, parents take on duties to provide a subset of goods that are collectively owed to all children. These goods include filial goods, the kind of goods that can only be provided by a constant caregiver, as well as other goods necessary for their flourishing. An advantage of this account is that it explains why society has a duty to find suitable parents for children, why it should assist or make it possible for parents to provide the goods needed for flourishing, and also why it must remove children from parents who are incapable of fulfilling their responsibilities.

Millum's theory gives what I consider to be plausible answers to a number of controversial cases. As noted earlier, it explains why accidental fathers can have parental responsibilities without having parental rights. It also explains why absentee biological fathers who were deliberately excluded from a child's life, but then shows up at some later point, can have an interest in forming a relationship with a child and yet not have a moral right or claim to do so. The theory has some interesting implications for non-traditional families created through artificial reproductive technology, divorce and remarriage, and same-sex partnerships, most notably that a child can have more than two real parents. Although his theory doesn't automatically resolve all disagreements, it offers a framework in terms of which such issues can be discussed. Consider, for example, the case of surrogate motherhood. Surrogacy is often viewed as a form of adoption: the surrogate is the real mother, but promises to transfer parental rights and duties to the intending parents. Against this, others argue that the intended parents are the real parents from the outset, and that the surrogate is merely gestating the baby on their behalf. As we've seen, Millum argues that some parental work can be contracted out, which is what happens in the case of hired caregivers. But whether the same is true in surrogacy depends on whether gestational care is the kind of parental work that can be contracted out. Millum points out that there is a limit to the amount and type of parenting work that others can do on behalf of parents. Generic work, such as clothing, feeding, and comforting a child, can be fulfilled by proxy parents, but responsibilities to provide filial goods, such as an intimate relationship or loving bond with parents, cannot be contracted out. In the case of surrogate motherhood, then, the question is whether gestational care is best described as providing generic goods or filial goods. Research on maternal-fetal attachment and, in particular, surrogates' own perspectives on their pregnancies, appear to support Millum's view: gestational care can be contracted out, which means that one can give birth to a baby without becoming a parent.

This book is an excellent example of how philosophy can shed light on extremely difficult and complex issues. Millum weaves together the various pieces of his theory of moral parenthood in a way that can only be described as masterful. The book is written in a style that is accessible and engaging, and will appeal to professionals and students in moral and political philosophy, political science, and sociology. It will be particularly useful as a primary text for a graduate seminar, as it gives an overview of the central concepts, debates, and theories that will leave the reader with a better understanding not only of moral parenthood but of the nature and origin of moral rights and responsibilities more generally.


Brighouse, Harry and Adam Swift, 2006, "Parents' Rights and the Value of the Family," Ethics, 117(1): 80-108.

Gheaus, Anca. 2012, "The Right to Parent One's Biological Baby," Journal of Political Philosophy, 20(4): 432-455.

Hall, Barbara. 1999, "The origin of parental rights," Public Affairs Quarterly, 13: 73-82.

Hill, J. L., 1991. "What does it mean to be a 'Parent'? The claims of biology as a basis for parental rights," New York University Law Review, 66: 353-420.