The Moral Habitat

Moral Habitat

Barbara Herman, The Moral Habitat, Oxford University Press, 2021, 249pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192896353.

Reviewed by Karl Ameriks, University of Notre Dame


This is an outstanding book: wide-ranging, beautifully written, well-organized, tightly argued, worth reading by any philosopher. It builds on Barbara Herman’s earlier path-breaking volumes, The Practice of Moral Judgment (1993) and Moral Literacy (2007). Herman’s third set of essays is not quite like the culmination of Kant‘s three Critiques, but this most recent volume—soon to be complemented by a fourth collection, Kantian Commitments—has an organic unity that lends structure to its effective defense of many of the main systematic aims of Kant’s critical ethics (albeit without treatment of its setting in Kant’s theoretical metaphysics). There is an obvious holistic orientation and a broadening of scope here, as Herman has followed Kant’s own trajectory with the realization that our moral life goes beyond individual judgments, and even a general capacity for moral literacy, since it must always be part of an ongoing construction (although that loaded term is not featured in this volume) of a surrounding and ever more adequate form of what Herman calls a “moral habitat.”

Readers who can still recall the 1960s may connect this term with Habitat 67’s example of practical modern housing, as well as with the building project that Jimmy Carter made famous and that has become ever more relevant in view of the huge surge in homelessness. Herman illuminates several ethical aspects of the current housing crisis, but only after a careful philosophical clarification of the very idea of a moral habitat as an essential setting for a genuinely humane life for a realm of interacting free and equal agents. This idea has clear roots in Kant’s “formula of humanity” and the project of building a “realm of ends”—what he also called a “moral world,” an “invisible church,” and an “approach to the divine realm” (my translation of eine Annäherung des Reichs Gottes) [6: 115]. (References in square brackets are to the volume and page of Kant’s works in the Academy edition and as translated in the Cambridge University Press Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant). Moses Mendelssohn is said to have looked at the first Critique by reading the final sections first, and there is much to be said for such a procedure. It certainly fits Kant, who was brought up in a heavily teleological culture and was oriented, above all, toward notions such as an all-encompassing highest good—despite sophisticated epistemological scruples about exactly how such an orientation can be justified in the aftermath of modern science.

As in her earlier work, Herman’s new book takes very seriously Kant’s notion of the obligatory ends of the happiness of others and the perfection of one’s self. She focuses on a range of Kantian duties, rather than rights, but concludes by arguing for some specific rights that Kant himself neglected, such as a right to housing and an end to gender-based discrimination. She concentrates on Kant’s principle of innate right in the Metaphysics of Morals (1797): “Freedom (independence from being constrained by another’s choice), insofar as it can coexist with the freedom of every other in accordance with a universal law, is the only original right belonging to every man by virtue of his humanity” [6: 237]. On Herman’s reading, this principle takes Kant’s position beyond contractualism because, “innate right’s recognition of embodied (human) rational agents’ claim to freedom of choice, tells a story of value and vulnerability for the sake of which duties, both juridical and ethical, give principled protection . . . within a framework of objective value” (120). Duties are not free-standing entities; “the right relation of duty to value is form to content” (3).

Despite Herman’s extensive references to Kant’s late work, her volume is not a “Kant book” in any narrow sense, for its concern is not mainly exegetical and it does not engage in sparring with other interpretations. It is guided by a contemporary, problem-oriented approach, and it defends the commonsensical thought that of course Kant understood that consequences are important, that duties can overlap and “the strictness of perfect duties does not bar exceptions” (10), and that the application of general principles must leave considerable room for judgments conditioned by circumstance and sensitivity.

The book has eleven chapters and is divided into three parts that have distinct orientations but a common philosophical perspective. There are helpful transitional chapters and all new essays in the final part of the book, but the heart of the book’s argument is contained in five extensive chapters (2–4, 6, and 7) that are versions of essays that have appeared elsewhere but are connected here in a way that gives the whole a genuine unity. The first part provides perhaps the most careful philosophical treatment anywhere of the significance of the imperfect duties involved with gratitude, gift-giving, and due care. The second part, which is the most directly Kantian, explains the systematic significance of the kinds of duties that are the focus of the first part. Herman shows how the diverse duties of the Doctrine of Justice (Recht, translated here as “Right”) and the Doctrine of Virtue (the two parts of the Metaphysics of Morals) are closely interconnected with one another in a way that reveals the special “systematic” strength of Kant’s general approach, his concern not with maximizing passive benefits but with doing justice to the developmental needs of a plurality of free but finite, dependent, embodied, and diversely-minded agents with equal moral status. In contrast to Kant’s earlier works, the Metaphysics of Morals contains what Herman calls “generative arguments” because they draw out for ethics the implications of the particular conditions of the “human life form” (85). In a third and final part Herman carries this Kantian approach further by discussing in careful casuistic detail the ethical complexities that regularly arise in contemporary life where there is a frequent need to take into account numerous overlapping duties.

Rather than presuming that Kant was dogmatically committed to a kind of rule-fetishism concerning act-types, Herman shows how the values underlying Kant’s principles clearly mandate considerable flexibility when applying general principles in complicated and changing situations. There is, for example, a default rule for respecting promises and truth-telling, but this is consistent with allowing for cases in which, in order to serve the “supporting value” of promoting rational communication, there is room for making exceptions (107). Here the basic point is that it is never enough to believe simply that we have a duty to tell the truth or keep promises. We need to understand what this duty is “for” (4, 78; cf. [6: 5]), how it serves a more general value involving rational communication and needs to be heeded in a sensitive manner that properly tracks this value. In this way, one can easily defuse worries about how Kantians should respond to a “murderer at the door” (109). (See also Wood 2008 and Varden 2010.)

This is a fundamental point, and one might go so far as to propose that Kant’s position would be less misunderstood if expressed not as a matter of acting “from duty” but of acting “for” it, that is, for what duty commands, which is to do the right thing for the right reason (69, 78, 230). The preposition “from” can imply that we are being pushed from behind, as if by a mechanical or mysterious immaterial force, whereas “for” fits the thought that in dutiful action we direct ourselves forward in freely intending a proper end. The moral command is not, for example, just to give proper change—as even a “confidence man” might—but to do so in line with and for the sake of a commitment to honesty.

It is perhaps because of this objective value-oriented approach that Herman at times calls her work “revisionary” (73), but it does not seem to me to be a revision of the fundamentals of Kant’s ethics. Her book is instead a correction of the common tendency in Anglophone philosophy to overlook the limitations that govern Kant’s Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), which was quickly put together as a mere prolegomenon to the presentation of the ends-oriented ethical system that Kant had been lecturing on for decades but managed to publish only in the final period of his busy career. In laying out the most general formal conditions for the possibility of a moral life for interdependent agents, the Groundwork was not deducing specific act-types (107) or filling out a full list of important duties.

No brief review can do justice to the numerous subtle arguments in Herman’s rich volume. In the following, I will simply note a few important claims of the key chapters, while adding some incidental observations from a somewhat broader historical perspective. On the whole, the work’s interpretative as well as substantive considerations are convincing, an exceptional contribution even in an era in which many others have also worked hard to make Kant’s ethics appear more appealing and less encumbered by widespread mischaracterizations.

Herman’s first chapters are concerned with “rehabilitating imperfect duties” as part of a larger project of showing how they fit in with Kant’s overall idea that the ethical and the juridical are “two parts of a common moral enterprise . . . in one we each do separately what we ought; in the other, the same we, acting together, are tasked to do something we cannot accomplish acting one by one” (x). Juridical duties are vital because “a formal idea of innate right sets conditions for realizing the moral status of persons” (2). Moreover, “just institutions do not just constrain, they give form to the moral personality” (2). Imperfect duties “provide guidance not by a rule for acting, but in their connection to duty-supporting value” (1)—that is, the values involved in respecting persons by perfecting oneself and helping others in light of their own permissible ends. 

Along this line, Herman gives the duty of gratitude a forward-looking and person-directed account. Proper gratitude is not best understood as a matter of balancing out a past debt. It is, instead, a matter of working out the correct ethical relation with others; overreaction or ingratitude can destroy a relationship (20). The main point about gratitude, and imperfect duty in general, is not the negative fact that it is non-coercible and non-formulaic, but the positive fact that it is “expressive and something importantly personal” (25). This fact is colored by a holistic normative context, since our ethical debts vary, depending on the kinds of roles that different persons have in our lives, as parents, friends, or colleagues (27). Acts of gratitude take place in a world that is juridically structured “to make life among . . . equals possible,” but mere rights “are not, however, the last word in moral relations” (23).

Herman goes on to use the example of gift-giving to make a point that has a general significance that goes far beyond this context. The point is that there is a set of actions that should be called “not impermissible” but “wrong nonetheless” (29). To burden someone else (even with good intentions) by offering an extravagant gift, or by going overboard in reacting to a modest benefit, is not to violate someone else’s rights or to break a fixed moral rule. Nonetheless, it is to do something that is other than simply less than ideal or good, for it can impose a pressure that inhibits someone else’s discretion and thereby subverts their “status as a reasoning agent” (49). Herman’s position here contrasts sharply with any reading of Kant that puts exclusive stress on rights and rules. It also contrasts with maximizing theories and systems like Fichte’s (whose Foundations of Natural Right was published under Kant’s influence but just before the Metaphysics of Morals), in which there is no leeway between what is permitted and what is mandated, so that in every situation there is only one kind of thing that is proper for the agent to do.

From an outside perspective, one might object that almost all of Herman’s perceptive account of the normative subtleties of gifts and gratitude is expressed in terms in which a caste-free situation of near equality is presupposed (e.g., in considerations of birthday presents). She notes, however, that in contexts other than analytic philosophy, the issue of gifts, beneficence, and reactions to them has attracted much more extensive and varied discussion (43). I suspect this is because “continental” scholars have tended to be consumed by the thought that the world is still structured in a deeply inequitable way, with all sorts of asymmetric traditions of exchange that are full of presumptions that are hardly transparent to outsiders. Everyday relations between people still involve so many social, economic, and psychological layers of long-term inequality, oppression, alienation, and self-deception, that focusing on examples of an individual proper gift and a “free” response can seem to miss what is most important (even if pedagogically understandable).

The secondary duty (which Kant calls “accessoric” [6: 448]) of due care plays perhaps the largest role in Herman’s treatment of imperfect duties (53). Here Herman makes a nice point that supplements Strawson’s notion of reactive attitudes, namely, that morality also includes important “proactive” attitudes (58). Being considerate and helping others properly is not just a matter of being technically on time or reducing pain (61) but is a way of maintaining a fitting personal manner with others. Our motives involve a “normative connection between end, value and action” (65) such that, in acting with due care, we are not swimming in a “soup of desire and inclination” (70) but are engaged, as whole persons, in treating others with properly intended sensitivity. This implies that “motive in such cases is essential to action description” (68), and the correct answer to “What are you doing?” is not merely a matter of behavior.

As with much of Kantian theory, Herman’s book, for all its attention to the fine detail of moral action, is for the most part an outline of an ethics that is still couched in terms of ideal theory. At one point Herman very properly notes that philosophical attempts to understand Kant have gone astray by taking as a starting point examples such as coming across a drowning stranger, and of thinking of moral issues primarily in terms of the situation of an emergency room (144). This correction is indeed important for understanding Kant, and it is a reminder that philosophy always should involve an attempt to find normative principles that can hold in general in ordinary relations, not just in dramatic situations. Nevertheless, one can’t help but admit that calls for “real politics” in philosophy are becoming ever more understandable given that, in most ways, the world now has truly begun to look like an overcrowded and underequipped emergency room, one that human beings have themselves created, in an Anthropocene that appears sick beyond cure (see Scranton, 2015).

It should not, in any case, be supposed that Kant himself was a naive idealist about humanity’s situation and human intentions. At a significant point in her discussion of innate right, Herman cites Kant’s 1784 essay on history (171, n.12). A key feature of that essay is that it is very much a consideration of what is only a possibility for a distant future. Kant did not claim that we are already in an enlightened age—let alone a Hegelian “end of history”—or that progress is surely around the corner with the advent of modern politics. On the contrary, his main claim, against radical pessimists and optimists alike, was that a realm of equality in treatment is far away at best —and yet, progress is at least not demonstrably impossible. His argument was that the (still distant) establishing of republican governments, even by means that are not morally motivated, might at least establish adequate preconditions for beginning to build concrete instances of such a realm. A natural question that arises, therefore, when considering what Herman calls the moral habitat, is whether she is aiming primarily to describe a situation that she believes we already are in (or at least quite close to), or whether she too is basically pointing to a (perhaps far off) future “correct” environment that, for the most part, still needs to be constructed. It is true that, in many local contexts now, much talk about equal treatment occurs; but the scandal is that such talk tends to arise in precisely those countries where the means—but not the will—to bring about real equality is present.

Maintaining even a minimal moral habitat requires considerable work. Kant recognizes that, prior to the nobler projects of virtue, there are fundamental everyday duties—of non-aggressiveness, property maintenance, and family life—that are not a matter of law or frequent reflection but are essential to keeping life from becoming a nightmare (81). Fortunately, we can be assisted by “well-founded public institutions of law,” which themselves benefit from moral habits and in turn provide “background conditions” for the real possibility of collaboratively developing a moral society with institutions that do ever better justice to both of the basic values of “independence and equal status” (191). All this starts from Kant’s basic claim: “Right is therefore the sum of the conditions under which the choice of one can be united with the choice of another in accordance with a universal law of freedom” [6: 230]. The “innate principle of right” in a legitimate Kantian legal order—which is something that has rarely been fully instantiated—turns out to “authorize”: reciprocal norms, equal status for all persons, an initial legal presumption of innocence, and guarantees of free speech (96, [6: 237–238]). Hence, on Herman’s reading, “because the content of Right has to adjust to make ethical life possible, it is truly a system of duties,” and it is “anchored in something like a moral basic structure” (86; cf. 102). Legal actions that support this order do not require good willing, but they are crucial for creating a compossible space, fit for an enormous variety of self-directing agents, in which numerous “new kinds of obligation-creating relationships” are created (100), and good willing can be morally effective.

In addition, Herman notes that, beyond both imperfect duties and juridical duties, the role of perfect but non-juridical duties deserves further attention. Beyond laws that rule out actions that hurt or control others, there is the perfect ethical duty of not even deliberating in terms of practices such as body-shaming or self-maiming (105), for such considerations go against the very notion of persons as ends in themselves. Furthermore, Kant’s understanding of the perfect duty of non-deception, which has often been grossly distorted, went far beyond matters of individual ethics, for it expressed a concern for the public value of “communicative integrity” (108), a value that has become all the more relevant and endangered now. The duty that condemns self-interested promise-breaking is much more than a matter of preserving individual purity. It is crucial because of its opposition to any form of false speech that would betray the “common rational endeavor” (109) of using our capacities to disclose what is real, for otherwise agents can hardly maintain a chance to make well-founded choices.

While Kant’s view is to be praised on all these points, Herman does offer one significant criticism. Although she does not reference it, this is an important point that happens to parallel a major concern of Fichte’s and also influenced Hegel’s world-changing emphasis on concrete conditions for mutual recognition. The objection concerns the significance of labor and the fact that Kant failed to see that persons deserve a right to employment, with enforced conditions of decency, if they are to have any respectable chance to fulfill their capacities as rational agents (107, n.50). The mistake of his era was to believe that what he called “active citizenship” should be granted only to those who already have an independent life with a “marketable” skill. He failed to consider that lifting this condition and providing a broad guarantee of work would provide a natural pathway for persons in general to gain active citizenship (189, n.2, 214, n.7).

In a transitional chapter called "Making the Turn to Kant," Herman goes so far as to deny that there is a “categorical imperative procedure” and proposes that, instead, we need to understand how duties are “transit points on a deliberative map to a coordinated system of ends and actions and institutions whose shared aim is our realizing the value of free and equal persons in a morally supportive social world” (73). All this is only possible because “we already have in place the capacity to be responsive to value in a motive-involving way” (65). Here Herman is committing herself to the existence of a moral capacity “for good willing” as a fundamental species feature of human beings (63, n.20), something not to be conflated with “occurrent ability,” talents, or accomplishments (110), and therefore present equally in everyone, even in infants (98, n.30). This crucial egalitarian point is still often missed in reactions to Kant—as it was, for example, in fateful German contexts long ago, when influential chauvinists of the worst sort claimed they were working in Kant’s name when they insisted that, above all else, Germans needed to obey nationalist and racist “duty” (see my 2020).

Even if the notion of a common moral capacity should be accepted as a basic universal and Kantian truth, with broad cosmopolitan implications, many questions can be raised about it. One relevant issue here, which very much concerned the first German Idealists, is the significance of social triggers for this capacity. Herman also recognizes the influence of our social environment, and how societies can often create fear and racial anxiety and thereby inhibit the proper use of one’s moral capacity (63). It can be argued that the doctrines of Hegel and Marx imply that, once we identify the biological, economic, and social conditions that ultimately generate the human motives that propel action, we know all we need. Since the main point then is to change unfortunate underlying conditions, the psychological triggers of proper action become an intermediate stage that can be a distracting focus. In contrast, and without offering a proof for it here, Herman holds on to the Kantian position that in ordinary circumstances human beings should be described as in principle capable of standing back from natural pressures and acting out of free respect.

This claim, however, leads to the further question of how we are to understand Kant’s distinctive idea of what this “standing back” means in a moral context. Like many interpreters, Herman sometimes—but only sometimes—seems to speak of our human moral capacity as simply a capacity for “reasoning” in the sense of a “capacity for rational action” (95 n.23) or “to make reasoned choices” (96). This familiar way of putting matters can obscure the fundamental distinction between uses of rationality in the sense of mere understanding, or instrumental/prudential decision-making, and Kant’s distinctive idea that there is a higher faculty of pure practical reason that is concerned, like reason in general, with freely aiming at what is unconditionally obligatory or true (hence the notion of an “end in itself” is by no coincidence similar to the notion of a “thing in itself”). The claim that this kind of pure capacity exists, or must be presumed even if is not demonstrable, has long been controversial. It should, in any case, be kept separate from the issue of exactly what Kant meant by our moral capacity. Fortunately, given Herman’s earlier work and her occasional references here to unconditioned categorical value as fundamental to Kant’s value theory (125, [6: 385]), she appears, on the whole, more inclined than many other interpreters to understand our moral capacity specifically in terms of Kant’s strong notion of reason, in contrast to mere rationality.[1]

Despite her emphasis on the pure aspects of Kant’s ethics, Herman insists that Kant’s notion of practical reason as a highest authority is compatible with a strong commitment to the value of human happiness. (This point has also been stressed in several writings by Stephen Engstrom; for an account of Herman’s earlier discussion of this value, see Reath 2011.) What is special about Herman’s appreciation of this point is her realization that, at first, it is not easy to understand Kant’s claim that a commitment to the happiness of others, as determined by their own ends, is one of our two basic imperfect duties. Herman’s solution is to argue that Kant understands well-being not as a matter of maximal passive feeling but of developing the powers of an “ordered self” (137), one that has learned how to shape intentions with an appreciation for being inevitably entangled with numerous overlapping duties and common projects with others. From such a perspective, a Kantian concern with happiness goes hand in hand with insisting on support for, and “participation in” (185), institutions such as public education, which create conditions essential for the proper exercise of independent rational agency throughout society.

This point allows Herman to make a relatively smooth transition from the basic details of Kant’s system to an account of the need to respond to structural injustice and acute contemporary problems (such as housing, refugees, and global poverty) through means that require going beyond individual help, singly or as an aggregate (150). So many difficult issues are skillfully addressed in this final part of her book that there is not adequate room to review them here, and it is unfair to focus on missed opportunities. Nonetheless, it would be helpful if Herman could go further, in future work, in developing this point: “an essential condition for the development of rational agency in persons is a morally necessary but empirically contingent accomplishment of some ‘we’: securing the conditions of Right, its institutions and distinctive duties” (171). Anyone who has reflected on the U. S. Declaration of Independence and has read Danielle Allen’s instructive account (2014) of its distinctive nature and significance, cannot help but notice the relevance of the historical phenomenon of the Declaration’s world-changing use of the idea of what “we the people” can do.[2] As Herman stresses, the moral end of “realizing the conditions of right . . . cannot be adopted . . . unless it is a common end,” and this comes with a “demand on juridical institutions: that the value of the objective common end be visible in the institutional structures and strictures of Right” (171). This point leads to the natural question of exactly who can be counted on to continue to make our crucial ends adequately “visible.”

Herman speaks of the need for agents of “moral change,” and she states that her approach is broader than John Rawls’ because it “implies the possibility of change and even experiment across the different strata of descendent duties” (209). With that point in view, I will conclude with a brief comparative observation about Herman’s perspective in relation to the historical context of Kant’s work. Throughout her book, Herman, like Kant, stresses the idea that morality involves a “system.” Kant’s stress on this term was understandable, given the tendencies of his era and the close relations between science and philosophy that he was familiar with from systems such as Descartes’ and Newton’s. This stress had unfortunate consequences, however, because the idea of an ambitious and certain philosophical system, which Karl Leonhard Reinhold and then Fichte, Hegel, and others developed in extreme ways, came to stand in the way of a proper understanding of Kant’s views and of more modest forms of idealism in general. Herman’s understanding of “system,” however, is in no way as dogmatic as that of the German Idealists. Like the best version of a broadly Kantian philosophy, it can be understood as a moderate form of holism, one that is open to change but avoids relativistic pragmatism by holding onto a few interconnected a priori principles that are closely tied to common experience.

When discussing possible agents of significant moral change, in a flexible and holistic context, Herman gives the following list of those with “rule-defined social roles”: “social worker, police officer, judge, legislator” (218). No doubt she would also agree that union organizers and religious leaders are relevant, as well as many others without “rule-defined” roles, such as the readers of her work, since the duty of encouraging change falls on everyone. From a historical perspective, however, there is a surprising omission here because there is no stress on inspiring cultural leaders, such as the many philosophically-minded writers who have been highly influential in calling for radical change: Milton, Rousseau, Paine, Price, Franklin, Jefferson, the Early Romantics (Hölderlin, Schlegel, Novalis) and their allies, Coleridge, Shelley, Wollstonecraft (referenced at 216, n.9), the American Transcendentalists, Whitman, and then Martin Luther King Jr. as well as numerous leaders of other liberation movements. (Herman appropriately cites a work by Bob Dylan, 220, n.11, but one hungers now for more examples of figures who, despite the powers of today’s charlatans and oligarchs, might truly reach the world at large and move it forward.)

The Early Romantics are of special relevance here because they tied themselves most closely to Kant, and they were most original in their critiques of pretentious systems and in the skillful intensity of their stress on the need for “universal progressive” change hastened by cultural catalysts like themselves.[3] In other words, they would most clearly welcome Herman’s idea of “the possibility of change and even experiment across the different strata of dependent duties.”[4] Unfortunately, the tragedy of a series of historical calamities, combined with the resurgent influence of overly rationalist and also anti-rationalist movements, obscured their progressive significance. Afterwards, from the era of Nietzsche onward, philosophers as well as leading writers in general tended to associate themselves not with thoroughly democratic movements but with avant-garde escapism and/or extremist ideologies. The crisis-oriented last sections of Herman’s work[5] lead me to conclude that its implications push far beyond moral theory and into the difficult question of what type of leaders and what kinds of writing and action (a new Dylan?), in our benumbed, tyrannized, and downward-spiraling era, can once again be truly effective, with low- and high-brow alike, in beginning to “redirect the moral arc” (220).



Allen, Danielle. 2014. Our Declaration: A Reading of the Declaration of Independence in Defense of Equality, New York: Liveright Publishing.

Ameriks, Karl. 2020. “The Fate of Dignity: How Words Matter.” In Kant’s Concept of Dignity, edited by Yasushi Kato and Gerhard Schönrich. Berlin: de Gruyter, pp.263–84.

Ameriks, Karl. 2021a. “Kant and Dignity: Missed Connections with the United States.” In Proceedings of the 13th International Kant Congress 2019, edited by Camilla Serck-Hanssen and Beatrix Himmelmann. Berlin/Boston, pp.27–47.

Ameriks, Karl. 2021b. “Dignity Beyond Price: Kant and his Revolutionary British Contemporary.” Kant Yearbook 13: pp.1–28.

Brusslan, Elizabeth Millán and Norman, Judith. 2019. “Introduction.” In Brill’s Companion to German Romantic Philosophy, edited by Elizabeth Millán Brusslan, and Judith Norman. Leiden: Brill, pp.1–17.

Cavell, Stanley 2003. Emerson’s Transcendental Etudes. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003), pp.171–82. I

Reath, Andrews. 2011. “Will, Obligatory Ends and the Completion of Practical Reason: Comments on Barbara Herman’s Moral Literacy.” Kantian Review 16: pp.1–15.

Scranton, Roy. 2015. Learning to Die in the Anthropocene: Reflections on the End of a Civilization. San Francisco: City Lights Publishers.

Varden, Helen. 2010. “Kant and Lying to the Murderer at the Door…One More Time: Kant’s Legal Philosophy and Lies to Murderers and Nazis.” Journal of Social Philosophy 41: pp.403–421.

Wood, Allen W. “Lies.” In Kantian Ethics (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2008), pp.240–58.


[1] Sometimes the most important point for Herman seems to be just maintaining the “authority” of reason in our decision-making (84, 125). I believe this idea is not enough if it is understood as a mere reflective ability to say that we are using “our own” rationality. A sophisticated computer, making proper “inferences,” might well “say” as much, no matter that all its actions are mechanically caused.

[2] Elsewhere I have traced the close parallels between Kant’s project and the Declaration. I have also explored the strangely unnoticed fact that Kant, unlike other figures of the era, largely ignored American thought and action at that time, even though its unique achievements (including the Constitution, written in 1787, right in the heart of Kant’s Critical period) corresponded most closely to his own basic Enlightenment beliefs: anti-colonialism, republican government, separation of church and state, and outlawing of aristocracy. This is not to deny that there were significant shortcomings in United States politics then, as well as in some of Kant’s prejudiced presumptions. See my 2021a and 2021b.

[3] The Romantics were likely influenced by Kant’s notion, in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), of “exemplary” accomplishments, and by his claim, in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793), that figures such as Job, Jesus, and Rousseau were responsible for revolutionary changes in attitudes to morality and religion.

[4] See e.g., Brusslan and Norman 2019. It is striking that when Thomas Mann, in one of the most significant reversals of the twentieth century, made his shift from aristocratic German nationalism to cosmopolitan democratic politics, he did so by invoking the complementary ideas of the Early Romantics and Walt Whitman.

[5] I suspect that, in places such as a reference to Thomas Piketty’s work (155, n.37) and remarks about “class inequality” (119), Herman is signaling that she holds a more radical, redistributive view than her book emphasizes. If so, she is proceeding somewhat as Kant himself did in his subtle late essays, which imply a progressive subtext despite having often been read as a defense of a kind of liberal status quo. See e.g., Stanley Cavell’s 2003 observations on Kant’s 1794 essay, “The End of All Things.” I am grateful to Barbara Herman for informing me of this reference some years ago.