The Moral Meaning of Nature: Nietzsche's Darwinian Religion and Its Critics

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Peter J. Woodford, The Moral Meaning of Nature: Nietzsche's Darwinian Religion and Its Critics, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 184pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226539898.

Reviewed by Christian J. Emden, Rice University


Peter J. Woodford's book is thin, concise, and elegantly written. It seeks to trace the central aspects of the controversial reception of Darwin among a select group of German neo-Kantian philosophers. Having said this, scholars of Nietzsche and of German neo-Kantian philosophy will not entirely agree with Woodford's overall argument. The book sheds fairly little new light on a crucial episode in the history of modern philosophy and it also tends to simplify the multilayered intellectual context in which neo-Kantian philosophers encountered Darwin. There is, however, a bigger problem.

From a historical point of view, Woodford is quite selective in the material he presents from Nietzsche, Georg Simmel, and Heinrich Rickert, and he often does not discuss their actual readings in the nineteenth-century life sciences, although seminal texts appear in the endnotes. From a philosophical point of view, the book raises many central questions that show the continued relevance of neo-Kantian philosophy around 1900 for current debates in the philosophy of biology and with regard to the nature and emergence of values and normativity. These questions, however, are never really addressed in any substantive way. Indeed, the most interesting and fruitful chapter does not at all deal with a neo-Kantian philosopher but with Nietzsche's Basel friend and colleague, Franz Overbeck, a Protestant theologian. This very much highlights what really is at stake in Woodford's book: his account of Darwin's reception among neo-Kantian philosophers is guided by a specific normative claim that Woodford seeks to extend from the nineteenth century into the present, namely the foundational importance, perhaps even primacy, of religion for understanding both values and nature.

Woodford, to put it more sharply, uses a crucial episode in the history of modern philosophy in the service of an attempt to bring religion back into philosophical debates about evolution. This is all the more surprising since Woodford's previous work has been solid and interesting, but the argument underlying the book quickly goes astray. Much like Thomas Nagel's peculiar Mind and Cosmos (2012) -- which was obviously the trigger for Woodford and provides his general theoretical framework (19-20, 28, 48, and 145) -- this book comes in the guise of a critique of what John McDowell once termed "bald naturalism," and it fully rejects any form of hardcore reductionist physicalism, but merely replaces the latter with an appeal to a strongly teleological metaphysics that is even more directly theological in orientation than Nagel's book ever was.[1] Where Nagel advocated for a return to a kind of Aristotelian "natural teleology" -- which is problematic, to say the least, but was not intended to be a theological claim -- Woodford effectively pushes this model to its natural conclusion, adopting an increasingly religious thrust.[2] Where Nagel simply, albeit questionably, pointed out that the world of values cannot be reduced to nature, Woodford views the autonomy of such a world of values as leading to the obvious conclusion that practical life is best understood in terms of religion, even though he draws this conclusion in often inconspicuous ways.[3]

Woodford's argument unfolds in four chapters, each dealing with a specific author, while the introduction sets out the broader justification of this account. Darwin's theory of evolution, at least in its German reception, raises the seemingly paradoxical problem of whether we can assume a "purposive structure of living things without involving an intentional designer" (2). Woodford, for good reasons, does not argue for the simply absurd claim of an intentional designer. But he quickly points out that this paradox -- purpose "yes," but designer "no" -- falls on particularly fertile ground in an intellectual context shaped by Romantic Naturphilosophie. This context is the deification of nature that he attributes to Herder, Goethe, and Schelling -- albeit without much explanation and without paying attention to the complexity of the intersections among philosophy and biology around 1800[4] -- and it supposedly leads to the question how Darwin's evolution by natural selection and variation can be reconciled with a theologically tinged philosophy: "What is the moral meaning of nature?" (3)

Woodford's question, to be sure, should not be misunderstood as asking whether there is moral meaning in nature, that is, whether moral values are natural kinds and such like; the book is not a study in hard-nosed moral realism. It is rather quite the opposite: while there is no meaning in nature, life nevertheless has to be assumed to be meaningful beyond nature, and such meaning is entirely reduced to "the evolution of morality and religion," which Woodford, throughout the book, largely regards as identical, as though religion is the exclusive framework within which to assess the normative validity of moral claims (7). What neo-Kantian philosophy, from Nietzsche to Rickert, thus seeks to achieve, according to Woodford, is to overcome the detrimental effects of a kind of Darwinian nihilism by turning toward the religious underpinnings of life. Although this might seem somewhat facetious, this argument could be summarized as follows: a) behind Nietzsche's interest in evolutionary theory stands a religious ideal; b) behind Simmel's discussion of value stands a religious ideal; c) behind Rickert's transcendental Wertphilosophie stands a religious ideal.

In this account, that views itself as justified on the grounds of G. E. Moore's well-known discussion of the naturalistic fallacy (8-9, 111, 123, and 127), human agency always appears as a special case in the evolutionary history of living things, not because it might be more complex or require consciousness, or intention, but mainly because human agency, without exception, strives toward an ideal, thus creating a world of meaning that Woodford views as intrinsically valuable and normative. This is Nagel's "natural teleology" redux, albeit in the form of a theological claim. Human agency, Woodford contends, must be related to, and it must be guided by, "intrinsic, non-instrumental values" (18); the autonomy of value -- a sort of moral anti-realism light -- cannot be questioned, and certainly not on the grounds of philosophical naturalism.

Following a somewhat shorthand account of Nagel -- and in the process coopting a range of analytic philosophers like Bernard Williams (60-61, 65, and 68), who would have been a tad bewildered about his prominence in Woodford's book -- Woodford hits on "the problem of normativity" and, disregarding most of the vast amount of recent philosophical publications on this issue, he reduces this problem to a question that really is more of an apodictic assumption that guides the remainder of his book, wondering "whether any ends could be vindicated as valid against the picture of humanity presented in Darwinian evolution" (19). Nietzsche would certainly answer this question in the negative. Woodford, however, claims the exact opposite: Nietzsche supposedly adopted a position -- Woodford calls it "realistic idealism," without ever defining what this is supposed to be (28) -- that vindicates the value of religion over the epistemic claims of the natural sciences. If hard-nosed reductionist physicalism seems unconvincing, then somehow the religious ideal must be the only alternative, or so Woodford appears to suggest.

Now, there is much to be said for a revisionist account of philosophers like Nietzsche, but such an account should not entail the very opposite of what any given philosopher actually claimed. Nevertheless, Woodford's thesis goes in exactly this direction: "Nietzsche turned to biology because he thought it was fundamental for providing the context within which human ethical and religious values would be shown to fit into the natural world" (29; cf. 136). We need to dwell on this statement for a moment. At first sight, Woodford merely seems to argue that Nietzsche turned to the contemporary life sciences in order to highlight evolutionary reasons for the value of having values, which is not particularly uncontroversial. Even religion, as Nietzsche accepted, can be seen to have an evolutionary function for human life. Nevertheless, what Woodford really argues in passages like these is something altogether different and more problematic: Nietzsche uses biology in order to show that religion has an intrinsic value separate, presumably, from mere biological robustness.

Nietzsche, of course, nowhere argues for any of this, and his remarks in The Gay Science (1882/87) and Beyond Good and Evil (1886) clearly suggest the exact opposite of Woodford's claim. While it is certainly the case, as Woodford notes, that Nietzsche pointed to "the necessity of valuing," and that even a life-denying asceticism remains part of our natural history (40 and 45), Nietzsche was not at all concerned with a conception of the "value of life" centered on the assumption that "the natural order of the living world was good in a final and ultimate sense" (48). In Nietzsche's world -- let's be serious -- there is no such thing as something being good in a final and ultimate sense.

Much of Woodford's misunderstanding of Nietzsche's position might have to do with the simplistic, and by now largely debunked, conclusion that Nietzsche was a straightforward anti-Darwinist. Following Nietzsche's reading of Wilhelm Roux and Carl von Nägeli, among others, Gregory Moore once used Nietzsche's presumed anti-Darwinism to highlight the limitations of Nietzsche's reception of the contemporary life sciences, bringing Nietzsche closer to Lamarck and Romantic Naturphilosophie.[5] This, to be sure, was a historical argument. Woodford, without engaging with the sheer complexity and theoretical disunity of the nineteenth-century life sciences in Germany, uses the same line of argument to highlight the continued relevance of Nietzsche for a religious conception of life.[6]

While British and American historians and philosophers of science often have a tendency to view the entire history of evolutionary theory in the nineteenth century through the lens of Darwin, such an approach has the side effect of underestimating the actual complexity of competing explanatory models in the nineteenth-century life sciences.[7] Embryologists like Roux, or cell theorists like August Weismann, often saw their various approaches not in competition with Darwin, or as a rejection of Darwin's theory of natural selection and variation, but as seeking to address issues that could not yet fully be explained along the lines of Darwin's position. Woodford, however, falls into the trap of assuming a widespread anti-Darwinism in German philosophy that supposedly underscores the autonomy of human values as intrinsically non-instrumental, thus implying more generally that our normative claims about the world lack any evolutionary function.

It is against this background that the remainder of the book traces the reception of Darwin and Darwinism in the writings of Overbeck, Simmel, and Rickert. Among these chapters, the one on Overbeck is the most interesting, particularly because Overbeck, in the English-speaking world at least, is largely relegated to the history of Protestant theology. Woodford situates his highly influential, and also rather controversial, writings in the broader context of the historicization of religion in nineteenth-century Protestant theology. Overbeck, in his famous essay How Christian is Our Present-Day Theology? (1873) as much as in the many notes for his unpublished Kirchenlexikon, rejected any attempt to modernize Protestant theology by bringing religion and science into a meaningful conversation. Religion was not concerned with epistemic claims but with questions of faith and with practical values, and any attempt really to historicize religion and theology could only achieve an account of the Church as an institution.

Woodford's account of Overbeck is on firm ground, and his suggestions echo those of Andreas Urs Sommer.[8] Overbeck seeks to foreground the question how the history of religion cannot escape value judgments, or what Overbeck describes as a Lebensansicht or Lebensideal. Nevertheless, Woodford embeds this well-informed historical account of Overbeck's hermeneutical questions in the framework he developed in his chapter on Nietzsche, thus lamenting that Wissenschaft -- which is not quite the same as "science," of course -- weakens "the vital interests out of which religions emerged" (69). While this is, indeed, Overbeck's position, what we really find on this occasion is Woodford speaking through Overbeck.

Woodford views neo-Kantian philosophy largely through the lens of a Lebensphilosophie that, despite the occasional nod to Darwin and philosophical naturalism, seeks to outline a transcendental theory of value without recourse to the way in which human beings are natural beings. As such, it is perhaps not entirely surprising that he does not view Simmel's later Lebensphilosophie as a departure from Simmel's earlier commitments to Darwin, but as an attempt to complete naturalism with a transcendental neo-Kantianism that seeks to emphasize the autonomy of values. This approach takes center stage in Woodford's discussion of Simmel's Philosophy of Money (1900), when he suggests that Simmel's "goal was to study the effects of economic conditions on ethical and even spiritual ideals related to the aims of human life in general" (88). But the point of Simmel's discussion of the normative import of money, exchange, and valuing is surely that "economic conditions" and "ethical . . . ideals" cannot really be separated at all, but that they are equiprimordial and intertwined to such an extent that we cannot escape the material underpinnings of the world of valuing. Woodford's narrative is guided, however, by the idea that there are value standards external to any material, or natural, conditions and that science, therefore, cannot fully grasp these standards. Religion has the clear advantage that it offers more than mere knowledge by making a "practical difference" (98), precisely because it is based on "the autonomy of Geist from Natur" (101; cf. 104).

While Woodford is undoubtedly correct in his characterization of later neo-Kantianism as responding to nineteenth-century materialism with a transcendental turn (e.g. Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, Wilhelm Windelband, and Rickert), he fully ignores how the first generation of neo-Kantians, from Hermann von Helmholtz onward, engaged the contemporary life sciences in a way that undercut the autonomy of Geist and that sought to fold the normative into the factual and vice versa.[9] From a historical perspective, then, Woodford seems to project the final iteration of neo-Kantian Wertphilosophie in the work of Rickert back into Nietzsche's writings, which were more informed by the first generation of German neo-Kantianism in the context, and in the aftermath, of the Materialismusstreit and the Ignorabimus-Streit.[10] As a result, Woodford has to conclude that biology cannot explain the world of the "ought" (114-7), as though Nietzsche did not develop a philosophy of value along the lines of the contemporary life sciences. What matters to Woodford, even in his discussion of Rickert's transcendental theory of value, is not the latter's philosophical arguments but rather its unarticulated support for the practical advantage of religion over both philosophy and science. What is couched in a "revival of Kantian Idealist philosophy" intent on giving primacy to the world of the ought, really is an affirmation of "the normative validity of the religious ideal" (128). Indeed, as Woodford begins to state more openly in his concluding remarks, the religious ideal should be understood as "a condition of the possibility" of representing "real and objective nature" (139).

"Moral Meaning of Nature" is a nice title. But perhaps the book should rather be called "The Religious Meaning of Life." Based on research funded by the Templeton Foundation, whose projects have always been keen to show that religion is compatible with scientific knowledge, or that scientists are somehow religious after all, Woodford's book is ultimately guided by a very specific worry: the spectre of nihilism, whose full force, of course, has been unleashed by an evolutionary biology happily free of ultimate ends (15, 29-33, 108, 117, and 132). -- Well, three cheers for nihilism, then.

[1] See John McDowell, Mind and World, new edn. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996), pp. xviii-xxii.

[2] See Thomas Nagel, Mind and Cosmos: Why the Materialist Neo-Darwinian Conception of Nature is Almost Certainly False (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012), pp. 91-3. Much of the current debate of Nagel's book ignores that this is basically a nineteenth-century debate. See, for instance, Emil DuBois-Reymond's famous lecture Über die Grenzen des Naturerkennens, 2nd edn. (Leipzig: Veit, 1872).

[3] See Nagel, Mind and Cosmos, pp. 97-126.

[4] For a proper assessment of these intellectual configurations, see Joan Steigerwald, Experimenting at the Boundaries of Life: Organic Vitality in Germany around 1800 (Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, forthcoming in 2019); John H. Zammito, The Gestation of German Biology: Philosophy and Physiology from Stahl to Schelling (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2018); Edgar Landgraf, Gabriel Trop, and Leif Weatherby (eds.), Posthumanism in the Age of Humanism: Mind, Matter, and the Life Sciences after Kant (London: Bloomsbury, 2018); Joel Faflak (ed.), Marking Time: Romanticism and Evolution (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2017); Robert J. Richards, The Romantic Conception of Life: Science and Philosophy in the Age of Goethe (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2002).

[5] See Gregory Moore, "Nietzsche and Evolutionary Theory," in Keith Ansell-Pearson (ed.), A Companion to Nietzsche (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006), pp. 517-31, and Nietzsche, Biology and Metaphor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002).

[6] For an overview of this complexity, Woodford might have consulted Lynn K. Nyhart's seminal Modern Nature: The Rise of the Biological Perspective in Germany (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2009), and Biology Takes Form: Animal Morphology and the German Universities, 1800-1900 (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994).

[7] A classical example for this approach is Ernst Mayr, The Growth of Biological Thought: Diversity, Evolution, and Inheritance (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1982), pp. 394-400. A more recent example is Tim Lewens, Darwin (London: Routledge, 2007).

[8] See Andreas Urs Sommer, Der Geist der Historie und das Ende des Christentums: Zur "Waffengenossenschaft" von Friedrich Nietzsche und Franz Overbeck (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1997).

[9] See, for instance, Gary Hatfield, The Natural and the Normative: Theories of Spatial Perception from Kant to Helmholtz (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1990).

[10] See the excellent collections edited by Kurt Bayertz, Walter Jaeschke, and Myriam Gerhard: Weltanschauung, Philosophie und Naturwissenschaft im 19. Jahrhundert, I: Der Materialismusstreit (Hamburg: Meiner, 2007) and Weltanschauung, Philosophie und Naturwissenschaft im 19. Jahrhundert, III: Der Ignorabimus-Streit (Hamburg: Meiner, 2007).