The Moral Nexus

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R. Jay Wallace, The Moral Nexus, Princeton University Press, 2019, 306pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691172170.

Reviewed by Rahul Kumar, Queen's University


The idea that, as Christine Korsgaard once put it, "The subject matter of morality is not what we should bring about, but how we should relate to one another" is one that resonates with moral and political philosophers. R. Jay Wallace's book brilliantly explores, with nuance and in detail, the reasons embedded in ordinary moral thought that undergird the appeal of a relational interpretation of moral reasoning, one that characterizes it as a matter of working out how we ought to regulate our conduct if we are to stand in a relation of moral equals to one another. It argues, in particular, for the merits of a distinctive, and contentious, version of such an interpretation that conceives of the whole of the morality of right and wrong -- interpersonal morality -- as a nexus of irreducibly relational requirements, or directed duties. These duties, or obligations, linking particular individuals to one another as duty-bearers and correlative claim holders, are owed by persons to one another simply in virtue of their standing as moral equals who, because they share a world, can affect one another through their actions and attitudes.

Wallace takes promissory obligation to be the paradigm example of a relational requirement, or a duty owed to another. A promise, in his terms, binds the promisor and promisee in a normative nexus they hold in common, consisting of a duty owed and a connected claim that it be honoured that the promisee holds against the promisor. Three features of the obligation, Wallace argues, account for its relational character. First, it collects reasons that enter the promisor's deliberations as presumptive constraints on the rational will, shaping the space in which planning agency operates. They figure in the promisor's deliberations, not as reasons whose force they are free to either ignore or discount, but as ones they must comply with, setting aside other reasons supporting plans that might conflict with doing so.

Second, the claim held against the promisor provides the warrant for the promisee taking an 'accountability-conferring stance' towards the promisor. This stance is manifest in their legitimately expecting their claim to be respected, and their understanding of the appropriateness, should they be wronged by the flouting or ignoring of the obligation, of resentment -- or some other form of blame -- as well as their being in a privileged position to forgive.

Third, a promissory obligation is agent-relative in character. It is an obligation for a particular person to relate to another person in the way to which they have a claim. Breaking a promise because you realize that you could better use the time to go around exhorting the less than morally upstanding to keep their promises would be to disregard, rather than to better comply with, the reasons for certain attitudes and actions that you have in virtue of having promised.

These three features, Wallace argues, are characteristic of not just promissory obligations, but of all the obligations that, taken together, constitute the whole of interpersonal morality, including those that bear on how we ought to relate to those with whom we have no antecedent connection. This last claim is controversial. Many philosophers have argued that we can't make sense of one person owing an obligation to another unless the duty bearer and the claimant are antecedently connected in some significant respect. Perhaps one made a promise to the other, or they share ties of friendship or family; maybe one is indebted to the other in virtue of what has taken place between them; or it could be that the relation of being fellow human beings can be considered a relationship. However best understood, some such connection seems necessary in order to make sense of morally wrong conduct as wronging another.

Wallace maintains that this can't be right. If an antecedent connection is a condition of the possibility of one person wronging another, then either we can't explain the plausible thought that I wrong a stranger by stepping on her gouty toe, or we have to accept something like the relation of 'fellow humanity' as constituting an antecedent connection between them of the right kind. Finding both options unacceptable, the way out of this quagmire, he proposes, is to characterize the normative relation of 'obligation owed to another' implicated in the nexus of duty bearer and claim holder as being a distinct, sui generis, normative relation. The way in which it constitutively connects the reasons for actions and attitudes of someone who owes an obligation to another to the claim of the person to whom the obligation is owed can be characterized, but it cannot be reduced to, or explicated in, non-relational terms.

Wallace aptly describes his book as making an interpretative case for a relational approach to moral reasoning. Taking "the notion of a relational normative nexus as a kind of theoretical primitive," it argues for the merits of understanding the whole of morality as constituted by relational obligations by exploring the extent to which "we can understand impartial morality as a domain that is structured in terms of a determinate relational nexus of this irreducible kind" (159). Describing 'morality', in the sense that is of interest, as 'interpersonal morality' -- a "domain that collects reasons and values that have to do, in some way or other, with the social significance of our actions for individuals who stand to be affected by them" (35) -- he takes the most prominent of the competing moral theories to represent alternatives for how best to characterize correct thinking about right and wrong in this interpersonal sense. Their success turns, in part, on their ability to either make sense of, or debunk, four desiderata imposed by the general concept of interpersonal morality. The first three -- that moral requirements constrain the rational will, that they are (for the most part) agent-relative in character, and the 'accountability-conferring stance' that a claimholder takes towards the linked duty-bearer -- mark an obligation as a relational obligation. The fourth, which Wallace flags as a distinctively modern aspect of how we conceive of morality, is that the moral community, to whom obligations are potentially owed, is a maximally inclusive group of individuals to whom obligations are owed in virtue of their equal standing.

Wallace identifies utilitarianism, voluntarism (which locates the grounds of interpersonal obligations in the recognition by agents of authoritative demands), and perfectionism (which locates the basis of an acts rightness in traits people need to be good human beings) as the prominent alternatives to the relational interpretation he favours. All, he argues, fail with respect to at least one, if not more, of the four desiderata. Utilitarianism, for example, is able to do justice to the maximally inclusive scope of the moral community as encompassing, e.g., future generations. But it neither satisfies nor gives us grounds for rejecting the other desiderata. Voluntarism and perfectionism do better with respect to some of them, but are not able to make sense of the inclusive scope of the moral community.

The relational interpretation Wallace advances, on the other hand, ably satisfies all four desiderata. The domain of those who can be wronged, for example, includes those able to conceive of themselves as capable of both wronging and being wronged -- encompassing most human beings, artificial persons, and sufficiently complex organizations -- human beings who can be wronged but, because they never develop the capacity for normative thought, cannot wrong others, and higher animals capable of structured protest against mistreatment.

The agent-relativity of moral obligation falls directly out of its relational structure: a claim is always the claim of a particular person held against another. The idea that there is reason to disregard a claim if doing so will result in others better complying with claims held against them rests on a misunderstanding of the claim's significance for the claimholder. They have a stake in the person against whom it is held responding appropriately to it. But what responding appropriately to it requires is that it function as a presumptive constraint on that agent's will. The claimholder is wronged, not in virtue of what happens to him because of what the agent does, but in virtue of his claim not figuring in the agent's deliberations in this way. Reactive attitudes like blame and resentment are responses by the wronged to the wrongdoer's failure to appropriately recognize his equal reality as a person by not giving his claim the appropriate deliberative significance. Seeking forgiveness and efforts to make amends are best understood as responses by the wrongdoer to the rupture this brings about in the relationship between her and the wronged claimholder, a relationship Wallace calls a relationship of "interpersonal recognition" (141).

Wallace, as earlier noted, rejects the idea that parties must be antecedently connected for one to be in a position to wrong the other. But the thought I take to motivate the need for such a connection is not implausible: we understand better the importance, from an agent's point of view, of avoiding wronging another if we think of doing so as constituting a kind of betrayal. Betraying another, however, requires there be a relationship in place to be betrayed. What Wallace suggests is that we can make sense of this importance, in a way consistent with moral obligations being self-standing, by taking being in a position to wrong another to constitute a potentially valuable relationship that you can navigate either well or badly. Looked at in this way, an agent's appropriate acknowledgment of another's claim is, from her own point of view, both what she has reason to do and an intrinsically valuable form of recognition of the moral standing of the claimholder as another person, equally real. So though an agent's complying with the claims of others can at times be burdensome, doing so makes an important contribution to her life because relating to another in this way is intrinsically valuable, whether or not the other person reciprocates.

Reasoning about what specific claims individuals, in certain circumstances, hold against one another requires, Wallace argues, the consideration of how the 'personal interests' of individuals -- understood as the interests a person has in "how one's own life goes, identifying things one cares about for one's own sake, so to speak" (161) -- stand to be affected by the different ways in which individuals could be required to regulate their conduct in the type of circumstance in question. Personal interests are relevant to filling out the content of the claims individuals hold against one another, I take it, because what the relational interpretation posits as what we fundamentally owe to one another is that each regulate her agency in a way that manifests appropriate recognition of the equal moral standing of other persons. The question of what complying with this irreducibly relational requirement specifically calls for only arises, however, when the personal interests of others stand to be affected by the way in which a person's agency manifests itself in the world. Answering it requires considering whether permitting a type of conduct, in certain circumstances, is justifiable to those whose personal interests stand to be affected; the conclusion reached fixes the claim they have with respect to such conduct. The claims of individuals, then, though not reducible to personal interests, are ultimately justified by appeal to the way their personal interests stand to be effected by the permitting or prohibiting of a type of conduct.

In describing reasoning about the claims individuals hold against one another in this way, Wallace self-consciously appropriates a form of reasoning central to Scanlon's contractualist account of interpersonal morality. Contractualism characterizes an act as wrong if so acting is not permitted by any principle justifiable, on grounds no one can reasonably reject, to those potentially affected by the permitting of such conduct. Reasoning about the justifiability of a principle to others involves comparing the ways in which the personal interests of representative individuals stand to be affected by the licensing of a certain course of conduct. A principle prohibiting a certain type of conduct, under certain circumstances, is one no one can reasonably reject if the most serious objection someone has to a principle permitting it is weightier than the most serious objection someone has to its prohibition.

This way of reasoning, Wallace observes, aptly describes a general template for extracting assignable claims from the personal interests of those who stand to be affected by an agent's conduct. One person can be said to have a claim against another because what she is owed is that agents "comply with a candidate moral principle, just in case the personal interests of that individual make it reasonable for someone in his or her position to reject alternative principles" permitting agents to act otherwise (180). The point neatly illustrates a general approach to reframing contractualism as an appealing theoretical elaboration of the general form of relational moral reasoning Wallace's discussion brings into relief.

The reason contractualism cannot, as it stands, be properly described in this way is that it does not characterize the domain of interpersonal morality as a system of directed duties and linked claims. An act that is wrong because so acting, under the circumstances, is prohibited by principles no one can reasonably reject might, but need not, be an act whose performance wrongs anyone, or that anyone (or everyone) has a claim to not have performed.

Contractualism, I take it, has commonsense on its side: we don't generally think that all moral wrongs involve wronging someone. Contributing to the alleviation of global poverty and disease, for example, is morally required of those who are in a position to do so at little cost to themselves. It is also a requirement that seems as central to interpersonal morality as the obligation to keep one's promises. But unlike a promissory obligation, it is considered an imperfect duty, one that allows discretion with respect to how you incorporate it into your life. It does not mandate either the form your contribution takes, nor to whom it ought to be directed. This discretion, together with the fact that, from the point of view of the duty-bearer, the duty is not associated with respecting the claims of individuals, suggest that it is not properly characterized as a directed obligation; failing to comply with it is wrong, but does not wrong anyone.

Wallace's point, however, is that if we do not conceive of interpersonal morality as a nexus of directed duties and linked claims, we sacrifice being able to make good sense of the deliberative and interpersonal significance, as well as the cosmopolitan scope, of the requirements constitutive of it. He addresses this apparent dilemma in the final chapter, arguing that intuitive convictions concerning the substance of what morality requires, that do not initially look to be concerned with requirements owed to particular individuals, are either more amenable to a relational analysis than one might initially think, or are insufficiently secure to put much weight on. The discussion covers a lot of ground; its objective, however, is not to try and settle substantive issues, but to illustrate the fruitfulness of reasoning about them in relational terms.

We can, for example, think of the duty of the affluent to aid those in need as one that invests each of the potential beneficiaries with a claim to assistance held against each who is in a position to do so. The reasons that justify the duty concern the personal interests at stake, whose comparative importance render any principle permitting an affluent person to not offer aid (presumptively) unjustifiable to those in need of it. The claims in question are admittedly unusual, insofar as what a claimant is entitled to demand of a particular affluent agent, against whom she holds a claim, is not that she in particular be aided, but that the affluent agent contribute his fair share to a collective effort by the affluent to aid those in need of assistance (207). Flouting this obligation wrongs those in need of aid, communicating to them a denial, or disregard, of their equal reality as persons. Their resenting, and in other ways blaming, the derelict affluent is fully warranted.

This point, concerning the interpersonal significance of flouting the duty to contribute, is plausible and easy to overlook. That this aspect of it is brought into relief by Wallace's account of its grounds helpfully illustrates how examining substantive moral questions in relational terms can be illuminating. On the other hand, holding those in need to be wronged by the affluent who do not contribute to their aid strikes me as implausible, and I am uncertain that doing so is forced upon us if we are to make sense of the reactive attitudes in question.

Consider the analysis of the duty to contribute to aid that contractualist reasoning invites. Though it is not relational in Wallace's sense, the concern it identifies as lying at the heart of interpersonal morality, that of conducting yourself in ways justifiable to others, can be aptly described as relational in character. The personal interests of individuals do figure in working out what, by way of conduct, is justifiable to them. But that is because many of the reasons they have for objecting to principles licensing certain forms of conduct appeal to their interests. It is relating to others in ways responsive to their reasons, not the promotion and protection of interests, that contractualism takes to be fundamental.

Looked at in this way, not contributing to the aid of those in need is wrong because no principle permitting affluent individuals to not contribute is justifiable, in light of their reasons for wanting assistance, to those in need. Acting wrongly, by not contributing, constitutes a failure to acknowledge, or a denial of, the comparative significance of their reasons, and by implication, their equal moral standing as persons. The gulf this creates between the wrongdoer and those who have good reasons for refusing to license the permissibility of their conduct constitutes a form of interpersonal estrangement.

My sense is that this gulf provides the right kind of warrant for those in need holding the derelict affluent accountable. If I'm right, the point calls into question the extent to which practices of interpersonal accountability actually support Wallace's relational interpretation. That we do not just register a person's conduct as being morally wrong, but are disposed, when the wrong concerns how she has related to another, to hold the person accountable for her wrongdoing is perhaps the most intuitively compelling consideration in favor of theorizing morality in relational terms. But it only speaks in favour of morality as a nexus of duties and linked claims if we accept that holding a person accountable for her conduct requires her having wronged another by disregarding the person's claim. The contractualist analysis of the duty to contribute implies this is something we ought not accept. It can be appropriate to hold a person accountable for acting wrongly, though the act wrongs no one, because the grounds of it being wrong to act in that way are relational -- in the sense of being concerned, not with the valid claims of others, but with the reasons they have for reasonably refusing to license the type of conduct in question.

In the abstract, this may seem like a small difference. But it makes a significant difference to the prospects of being able to make sense of the content of interpersonal morality in relational terms. Consider, for example, a standard non-identity problem case, in which a person is faced with a choice between conceiving a child now, knowing that there is a non-negligible risk that it will be born with significant physical impairments, and taking a safe, costless drug for six months before conceiving that will vastly reduce the likelihood of impairment. Many share the intuitive conviction that the objection to not taking the drug is relational, having to do with how she would be relating to the future child. Sometimes theorized as a violation of the child's right, Wallace suggests that we better get at the insight behind the positing of such a right by attention to how the implications of taking the drug for the child's non-comparative interests underwrite its claim that it be taken (212).

The problem with this move is that it's hard to see how it equips us to respond to the example's challenge: how can not taking the drug wrong the child who is then conceived if that child would not have come into existence had it been taken? The need to identify a claimholder is only pressing, however, if we assume that the alternative is to accept that the moral objection to not taking the drug, if there is one, has to do with making the world impersonally worse, not with how one would relate to the prospective child. But if we don't start out with the assumption that theorizing the objection in relational terms requires identifying a party who stands to be wronged, we are in an arguably stronger position to defend the intuitive conviction that the wrong of not taking the drug is relational, not impersonal.

Wallace's book adduces a range of considerations in support of understanding the relational character of interpersonal morality his way. I've raised doubts about one of the connections he makes, setting aside several others that merit, and are certain to repay, careful scrutiny. To my mind, that it invites and repays this kind of scrutiny is part of what makes his book a major contribution to moral theory. It presents the appeal of a relational interpretation of morality in a way that makes it accessible to those who find its attractions mystifying, while simultaneously forcing those of us already drawn to theorizing about morality in relational terms to carefully consider exactly what we take that to involve.


Thanks to Andrew Lister and Louis-Philippe Hodgson for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Korsgaard, Christine. 1996. "The Reasons we can Share: An Attack on the Distinction between Agent-Relative and Agent-Neutral Values" in Creating the Kingdom of Ends. Cambridge University Press. pp. 275-310.