The Moral Psychology of Hope

Moral Psychology Of Hope

Claudia Blöser and Titus Stahl (eds.), The Moral Psychology of Hope, Rowman and Littlefield, 2020, 302pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786609724.

Reviewed by Daniel Telech, Polonsky Academy, Van Leer Jerusalem Institute


Claudia Blöser and Titus Stahl have assembled a wide-ranging volume on the nature, history, and social significance of hope. The volume does not skimp on history; six of its fifteen chapters are focused on the philosophical history of hope, and others include extended discussion of historical figures and traditions. The volume makes contributions, too, to our understanding of the nature of hope, considered both as an attitude and trait (perhaps a virtue) of character. The volume closes with a section on hope's "social contexts", where attention is given to topics like hope's role in political justification and the rationality of hoping for generalized human prosperity in the face of possible environmental collapse. It's a rich volume. I'll have occasion below to touch upon each of its chapters, but I focus on the volume's contributions to our understanding of hope's nature.

The last two or so decades of philosophical discussion of the attitude of hope can be characterized by a shift from the "standard view", according to which hope is composed of i) the belief that some outcome or state of affairs X is possible but not guaranteed, and ii) the desire that X be the case. The standard view, it is generally held, not only fails to provide sufficiency conditions for hope; it seems, more damningly, to count instances of despair -- hope's opposite -- as instances of hope. For, despair also intuitively involves beliefs and desires of the above sort. (Indeed, as several have noted, it seems that two agents can assign the same probability to some outcome, and desire that outcome to the same degree, yet one be filled with hope and the other, despair.) Accordingly, it is now widely held that some further component -- in addition to belief and desire -- must be added to procure sufficiency conditions for hope. Several such components have been identified (for references, see works cited on pp. 2, 115, 232.) A useful way of characterizing what these recent proposals have in common is found in Adrienne M. Martin's chapter, where Martin writes,

a rough consensus has recently emerged, that hope has three primary component parts: first, a belief that the hoped-for outcome is possible but not guaranteed; second, a desire or preference for that outcome; and some third thing that amounts to a positively-toned "what-if" attitude toward a future containing that outcome… (231-32)

In contrast to the despairing agent, who may desire X and believe that X is possible but not guaranteed, the agent who hopes has a positively-toned "what-if" attitude concerning X's obtaining. The going view, in other words, reflects that in contrast to despair, hope involves a positive orientation toward the possibility of that which is desired.

Katie Stockdale challenges this idea. In particular, Stockdale's chapter challenges the idea that, to the extent that hope is emotion-involving, it involves positive emotion. Stockdale contends that attention to non-ideal social conditions reveals there to be an overlooked, and negatively valenced, species of hope. This type of hope, "fearful hope" as Stockdale labels it, is not only associated with, but constituted in part by, fear. Its affective tone is wholly negative. Stockdale provides in support of her proposal an example in which an African-American woman named Kayla is pulled over for no apparent reason and experiences a negatively valenced attitude as the officer approaches her car. Stockdale characterizes Kayla's attitude as a "fearful hope" that "the police officer I am about to encounter does not use violence toward me" (121). Given, however, that Kayla represents the officer as "threatening", it is unclear why we would not characterize Kayla's response, more simply, as one of fear. Fear about some possible state of affairs, after all, involves viewing that state of affairs as threatening or dangerous. Stockdale describes Kayla's attitude as hope for some omission -- namely that the officer not act violently toward her. But, can we not make do with attributing to Kayla the more familiar response (i.e., one directed not toward omission but action) of fear that the officer might behave violently toward her? The word 'hope' can typically be employed to describe the person experiencing fear: even the person who fearfully flees from the menacing dog, for example, can be described as 'hoping to escape the dog'. It is unclear, however, whether this linguistic fact licenses a view of the mental economy of these fearful agents as including an attitude of fearful hope in addition to that of fear, especially as the future-oriented nature of fear is poised to account for these agents' thoughts about safety. These worries about descriptive adequacy and moral psychological payoff may be especially weighty given that Stockdale's view comes with the cost of rejecting a unified account of hope as partly constituted by a positive outlook.

Matthew Benton's chapter introduces readers to the relationship between knowledge and hope. Benton provides linguistic support for the thesis that hope that p is incompatible both with knowledge that p and knowledge that not p; when one hopes that p, one does not know whether p. Benton turns in the latter part of the chapter to questions concerning the rationality of continuing to hope in the face of mounting evidence against the hoped-for outcome's obtaining. As Benton notes, sometimes the persistent hoper is lauded for their 'steadfastness', while at others times they are met with derision for 'being unrealistic'. Benton proposes that the rationality of persevering in hope, despite mounting counterevidence to the contrary of one's hoped-for outcome, will depend on how resilient one can anticipate being in the face of further disappointment. As such, the rationality of persevering in hope depends on both theoretical judgments and practical judgments.

In "Is Hope a Moral Virtue?", Nancy E. Snow answers the title question in the affirmative, adding to her previously published views that hope can be both an intellectual virtue and a democratic civic virtue. Snow develops a broadly Aristotelian account of hope as a moral virtue, giving close attention to the development of hope qua natural virtue through to hope qua moral virtue, where a mark of the latter is its being guided by practical wisdom. For Snow, hope bears a non-accidental connection to a positive agential orientation, as "Having hope is part of a positive, forward-looking outlook that is open to future possibilities and positions the hoper to engage her cognitive, affective, imaginative, and agential capacities in efforts to attain future goods." (183) In developing a view of hope as a moral virtue, Snow considers and rejects the non-Aristotelian view that hope is a structural virtue, in Robert Adams's sense.

Samantha Vice's "Pessimism and the Possibility of Hope" argues for the compatibility of a hopeful disposition with pessimism, where pessimism is understood as "the perspective or attitude on the human world that is skeptical of the possibility of significant moral progress, and that considers the harm that humans cause to be morally more salient and weighty than the good they bring about." (154) Taking her lead from Gabriel Marcel, Vice joins those who understand hope (or rather, hopefulness) as positive agential orientation, one from which the "future [is] considered open and receptive to our efforts" (157). Thus construed, hope finds its opposite in despair rather than pessimism. Special attention is given to differences in temporal phenomenology between hope and despair. To despair, according to Vice, is to "capitulate, whereas to hope is to refuse to capitulate." (158) Hope is in this way characterized as a form of patience (an idea that coheres with recommendations to the effect that we 'not give up on', and, 'hold onto', hope). Intriguingly, Vice construes hopefulness in positive aesthetic terms, writing that there is a "suppleness and grace to the refusal to capitulate." (159)

"Hope in Contemporary Psychology", by Matthew W. Gallagher, Johann M. D’Souza, and Angela L. Richardson, focuses on the influential model of hope developed by C.R. Snyder, according to which hope picks out a trait that involves viewing oneself as an effective agent. That is, on the dominant model,

hope [is] a two-fold cognitive trait that represents the ability to identify strategies to achieve one's goals (i.e. pathways thinking) and to have the motivation and determination to successfully implement those pathways (i.e. agency thinking) to achieve one's goals (Snyder 2002; Snyder et al. 1991). (192)

Those "high in hope" -- according to several scales of measurement (outlined in the chapter) developed by Snyder and others -- are distinguished from those high in optimism in that the high hopers believe not only that their aims will be satisfied, but that they will be satisfied through their own agency (196). The chapter also discusses evidence for several hope-based therapeutic interventions, including those that appear to have some effectiveness in lowering symptoms of depression and anxiety.

In "Interpersonal Aspects of Hope", Martin presents a view of the kind of hope that persons invest in others -- interpersonal hope -- providing along the way a general taxonomy of hope. On the "socially extended agency" conception of hope developed by Martin, "investing hope in a person is hoping to extend one's agency through theirs." (Martin 2020: 230). Martin's paradigmatic example is one in which a father invests hope in his daughter for a better life. The father's interpersonal hope consists in hoping to extend his agency through his daughter, which is done by his providing his daughter, the investee, with "agential resources". These include not only material resources, but the work involved in raising and educating a child, along with emotional and motivational resources. The account on offer is rich, and the chapter may be of special significance to those interested in the moral psychology of participant attitudes beyond the much-discussed triad of resentment, indignation, and guilt. For, Martin develops her view with an eye toward the range of interpersonal responses we have when the hopes we invest in others are frustrated (e.g., let down, betrayal) or realized (e.g., appreciation, pride, gratitude).

While I think Martin discusses an important and overlooked normative phenomenon, I wonder whether the centrality afforded to the hoper's agential contribution risks leaving out instances of interpersonal hope. We seem capable of investing hope in agents with whom we are not personally engaged, and to whom we cannot extend our agency in the manner evinced by the father. Suppose, for example, that Belle is a hermit living in the mountains, is equipped with satellite television, and has a passion for figure skating. Over the last few years, Belle has developed an interest in Alicia, a budding figure skater. Belle is taken by Alicia's grace on the ice, seeing in her considerable potential. Perhaps Belle and Alicia also share a national background, where the nation is unrepresented in figure skating at Alicia's level. Suppose Alicia is about to perform in her first winter Olympics; Belle watches with excitement and nervousness. Although Belle does not (and we can render the example such that she cannot) contribute agential resources of the sort that might be provided by her friends, family, coaches, and even other fans (via cheering in the stands, buying merchandise), it nonetheless seems plausible that Belle can invest hope in Alicia (e.g., to succeed as a skater, to continue developing). Martin can say that Belle is emotionally invested in Alicia, and this is surely right, but to understand this as a case of socially extended agency seems strained at best. In discussing similar cases, Martin claims that it may be reasonable "for fans of athletic or political celebrities to 'feel let down by' poor performances or failures to uphold values the fans felt they had in common" (236, italics added). This sounds importantly right, but it seems to point in the direction of a view of interpersonal hope centered on something like the sharing of value -- which might be done from afar -- rather than the extending of agency.

I turn now to the volume's historically focused chapters. In "Hope in Archaic and Classical Greek", Douglas Cairns argues for the measured thesis that, although the Greek word elpis sometimes means roughly what we mean by "hope", the semantic range of elpis is too broad to map neatly onto our concept of hope. After arguing for this thesis via Aristotle and Plato, Cairns turns to Classical Greek poetry, where elpis is construed as a deity capable of providing spiritual sustenance but which occasionally sets agents up for the frustrations attendant upon striving after the unattainable. Elpis in this way operates within a worldview where human aspirations must be kept in check by an appreciation of the extent to which our successes and joys depend upon myriad factors beyond our control.

In "Hope in Christianity", Anne Jeffrey maintains that two kinds of hope can be distinguished on a Christian account: i) hope directed toward possible events, and ii) hope in God. The latter is characterized as including the "desire for union with God" (42), where this is not to be understood as a species of hope for the obtainment of some event. That is, God-directed hope is irreducible to event-directed hope, in part, Jeffrey maintains, because God-directed hope need not have a determinate object. Jeffrey provides as an example the hope that Abraham places in God "when he leaves his home on God's directive . . . [A]t that point he doesn't know what to expect from God." (42) It isn't clear, though, why we should not characterize Abraham instead placing trust in God, for trust seems to more comfortably take an agent as its object without also taking some further event/action as its target. Of potential interest to those considering epistemological aspects of hope is that hope is sometimes understood to be accompanied by a kind of non-evidentiary certainty, attained by faith, where "Faith consists in confident adherence to a proposition with certainty but without full understanding" (45).

In "Hope in Kant", Blöser develops a unified account of hope as discussed across a range of Kant's works (the first and second Critiques, the Religion, and Kant's political writings). A key assumption on the view presented is that hope presupposes that some end is viewed to be beyond one's power to realize. But while this presupposition distinguishes hoping from choosing, to distinguish hoping from wishing, a second key assumption is necessary, namely, the presupposition that the end has grounds, i.e., that it can be brought about, through some power. As Blöser further maintains, while Kant holds that we lack knowledge of hope's grounds, hope may be rational insofar as it is rational to have faith or "moral belief" in the grounds of one's hope. One such moral belief that we may rationally hold, according to Kant, is that in the existence of God and an afterlife, for the moral law commands that we act such that we are deserving of happiness, but the present world is not one in which happiness is guaranteed by morally worthy action. On Blöser's reading, Kant advances a structurally parallel argument for the rationally of hope for perpetual peace. We are under a "duty to promote and thereby approximate perpetual peace" (69), and so we can hope for perpetual peace, but as we cannot assume that we can achieve this end on our own, this hope presupposes faith in its grounds, namely, in providential order. In addition to identifying possible weaknesses in Kant's various arguments, Blöser attends to the question whether hope occupies a distinct motivational role in Kant's moral psychology.

Roe Fremstedal's chapter, "Kierkegaard on Hope as Essential to Selfhood", advances the claim that Kierkegaard holds that a coherent practical identity requires not only, as others have argued, wholehearted commitment to a moral ideal but also the "hope that our ideals are realizable" (75). An odd feature of the view is that it appears to be a matter of stipulation that despair involves a double-mindedness, and so precludes a coherent practical identity. It may be that this reader simply requires greater familiarity with Kierkegaard on despair, for as discussed by Fremstedal, it is a methodological commitment of Kierkegaard's that his account of hope is developed via negativa, working upward, as it were, from despair.

Before turning from 19th Century European philosophy, I note that in several places in the volume -- including the editors' introduction and the aforementioned chapter -- the claim that 'Nietzsche is against hope' is made. Nietzsche is admittedly against hope in the promise of theism, particularly insofar as such hope serves to pacify one's aspirations for this world. But to conclude from this that Nietzsche is 'against hope' is like concluding from Nietzsche's hostility toward the effects of perceived-to-be irredeemable debts of gratitude toward a self-sacrificing creator that Nietzsche is 'against gratitude'. While Nietzsche would not advocate for hope to the exclusion of agency, his positive philosophical project is importantly future-oriented and in many ways characterized by hope. More strongly, Nietzsche's stance on the prospect of a Dionysian future of music, the overcoming of nihilism, a revaluation of values, etc., are arguably unintelligible without understanding Nietzsche as a philosopher of hope.

Sarah Sitzlein's "Pragmatist Hope" covers a lot of ground, beginning with the early American pragmatists (Pierce, James, Dewey) and concluding with "neo- and contemporary pragmatists" (Rorty, Judith Green, Cornel West, Patrick Shade, Colin Koopman). Sitzlein understands "pragmatist hope" as "a set of habits" (103), where these habits comprise perceptual, cognitive, and motivational dispositions to creatively reimagine our circumstances in response to challenges encountered in a non-ideal world.

In "A Zen Buddhist Conception of Hope in Enlightenment", Rika Dunlap argues -- pace those who identify hope as a future-oriented state, and as such either an obstacle to enlightenment or a mere stepping stone toward it -- that Dōgen's Zen Buddhism affords a present-oriented conception of hope on which hope is a good constitutive of enlightenment proper.

In "Political Hope and Cooperative Community", Stahl enumerates several functions that hope may occupy in a political theory and focuses on hope's possible justificatory function, arguing that hope for an ambitious form of community (in something like the sense employed by Rawls) can provide grounds for endorsement of a just liberal society.

In "Hope for Material Progress in the Age of the Anthropocene", Darrel Moellendorf argues that, in the face of the environmental destruction wrought by capitalism, it is nonetheless rational to hope for generalized human prosperity. Moellendorf's argument proceeds by scrutinizing and amending the mechanism identified by G.A. Cohen to explain the historical tendency of the growth of productive forces. Missing from Cohen's view, argues Moellendorf, is appreciation of the contribution made by sufficiently favorable environmental circumstances, such that "when humans labor, improvements can be passed on to at least some successor generations" (258). Moellendorf levies empirical support for this "fact of climatic favorability", as he dubs it, from work in evolutionary theory on the circumstances underlying the advent of behavioral modernity and from data concerning growth attributable to the Industrial Revolution. According to Moellendorf, given the environmental destruction attributable to factors underlying growth in productive capacity, future growth and eventual generalized prosperity cannot be taken for granted; these can, however, be rationally hoped for. That is, it is rational to hope that "the facts of intelligence and rationality . . . can be marshalled to solve the problem of environmental destruction, which is itself becoming a productive problem." (260) Moellendorf leaves open whether this requires that existing property relations be replaced or merely revised.

Given its breadth, there is likely to be something of value in the volume for a wide range of readers across disciplines including philosophy, history, theology, and political theory.