The Moral Rights of Animals

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Mylan Engel Jr. and Gary Lynn Comstock (eds.), The Moral Rights of Animals, Lexington, 2016, 296pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498531900.

Reviewed by Dan Hooley, University of Toronto


The attitudes of philosophers on our obligations to other animals and the view that other animals possess certain moral rights have shifted considerably in the last 40 years and a great deal of credit for this shift is owed to Tom Regan's The Case for Animal Rights and subsequent work. This excellent anthology grew out of a 2011 workshop held in Regan's honor and is dedicated to him. It features fourteen essays all of which intersect with Regan's views in some way. The authors largely defend the view that other animals have moral rights and those who don't hold that we have significant obligations to other animals. The essays succeed at exploring, critiquing, and expanding upon Regan's work in a way that is both rigorous and detailed, while accessible to those new to Regan or the animal rights literature.

The book has three parts. Part 1 focuses on the theoretical basis of animal rights, and responses to objections to animal rights. Part 2 looks at questions relating to the comparative value of human and nonhuman lives, with a focus on the comparative harm of death for humans and animals and the question of whether or not humans and animals have an equal right to life. Part 3 turns to the practical import of animal rights.

Part 1 begins with an essay by Regan, which succinctly summarizes the argument he made in The Case for Animal Rights that all individuals who are "subjects of a life" -- conscious, sentient individuals with an experiential welfare who have beliefs and desires and some awareness of the past and future -- have certain basic moral rights. This essay, combined with the relevant summaries in subsequent chapters, provide a sufficient overview of Regan's views, so those who have not read Regan before will not be lost.

In Chapter 2, Jeremy Garrett argues that deontological libertarians should accept animal rights. Garrett argues that libertarian views harmonize quite nicely with Regan's defense of animal rights and defends this view against objections from Nozick. In Chapter 3, Mylan Engel Jr. makes a straightforward and compelling case that if all humans have moral rights, then many other animals do as well since these animals have the properties that confer rights on humans. Engel also argues that most of the harmful uses of animals are wrong even if animals do not possess rights. In Chapter 4, Nathan Nobis considers some of the limitations of Regan's response to Carl Cohen's well-known "kind" argument, which holds that since animals are not of the kind of beings who are moral agents, they do not possess rights, and develops stronger objections to Cohen's position. In Chapter 5, Anne Baril argues that the equal inherent value of all animals does not demand intervention to prevent predation among wild animals. She argues that respect for wild animals, as the kinds of beings they are, does not require intervention to prevent predation.

Central or important to many of the essays in Part 1 is the much discussed (and poorly named) "Argument from Marginal Cases."[1] Versions and variations on this argument are put forward here by Regan, Garrett, Engel, and Nobis. Engel and Nobis, in particular, do a superb job challenging many of the common attempts to defend the view that all humans possess certain basic rights but all nonhumans do not. These essays present important challenges to those who think some form of human exceptionalism is defensible.

One important point made by Engel is that defenders of human exceptionalism must provide a plausible rationale for why any specific capacity, claimed to be both necessary and sufficient for the possession of a given right, is connected to that specific right in question. Many attempts to do this fail the test of having a plausible rationale. Moral autonomy is relevant to whether or not beings can be held morally accountable for their behavior, but it is far from clear why being morally autonomous is a necessary condition for possessing a right not to be harmed. This is because being morally autonomous is not necessary to have a morally relevant interest in not being harmed. As Engel notes, it is a much more plausible rationale to think that sentience is the morally relevant rights-conferring property for the right not to be harmed. This capacity has a much more plausible connection to the specific right in question.

A similar point is made by Nobis in response to Cohen's "kind" argument. Cohen claims all humans (regardless of cognitive capacities) have moral rights because they are members of a kind of being that possess moral agency. But this lacks a plausible rationale when it comes to the specific rights of non-rational humans (such as babies or individuals with severe cognitive disabilities). Cohen claims these individuals have rights related to autonomy because they are members of a kind that is morally autonomous. But even if we concede this, it would be wrong to let them make all the decisions about their lives that we allow paradigmatic adults to make (75). They seem to lack these rights because they do not possess the relevant interests. Once we recognize this, however, it is not clear why membership in a kind is morally relevant: we can be classified in different groups, but we don't always have the rights typical members of those groups possess.

Part 2 focuses primarily on the comparative harm of death for humans and animals and the question of whether or not humans and other animals have an equal right to life. In Chapter 6, Aaron Simmons argues that while life has less value for animals than for humans, they nevertheless possess an equal right to life, such that the negative rights they possess are just as stringent as those possessed by humans. In Chapter 7, Molly Gardner argues that Regan's rights view does not, as he claims, actually prohibit animal research in all cases. She develops an alternative position, what she calls the "attenuated rights view," that balances rights with a somewhat complex but interesting weighing principle. This view generates a strong presumption against animal research, but would not justify a categorical opposition to all harmful research involving animals. In Chapter 8, Evelyn Pluhar draws on ethological research to argue that all vertebrates and some cephalopod invertebrates should be seen as subjects of a life. She defends the view that all subjects of a life, who have satisfying lives and opportunities for future satisfaction, are harmed equally by death. In Chapter 9, Alastair Norcross argues that Singer's account of moral considerability -- where all sentient creatures deserve equal consideration -- can be combined with Regan's account of subjects of a life. Norcross argues that all sentient creatures deserve equal consideration, but that subjects of a life have a lot more to lose by dying than "merely" sentient beings. And in Chapter 10, Gary Comstock gives empirical evidence that suggests much of the time human behavior is controlled by non-conscious mechanisms. Comstock uses this to argue against the view that the ability of humans to control their behavior is a morally relevant difference separating humans from other animals: if animals act "on instinct" much of the time, so do we.

The question of whether or not humans are harmed more by death than animals and the related question of whether or not humans and animals have an equal right to life are some of the most difficult and perplexing questions in animal ethics. One notable feature of the essays in Part 2 is the diversity of views presented on these issues, despite the (mostly) shared belief that nonhuman animals possess basic moral rights.

Both Simmons and Gardner, for example, defend the common position that life has more value for (most) humans compared to most other animals because of our more sophisticated cognitive abilities. Simmons defends this by arguing that our more sophisticated cognitive capacities allow us to experience more creative and intellectual pleasures that are quantitatively and qualitatively superior to other pleasures (110).

One important objection not considered by either author concerns the ways in which the more sophisticated capacities of humans might allow for qualitatively and quantitatively worse forms of displeasure or negative experiences. If human life has more value because of the quantity and types of pleasures and valuable experiences we can enjoy, why are the distinct types of suffering, anxiety, and agony we can experience not relevant? If the claim is that humans have more valuable lives because of the net quantity and quality of pleasure and valuable experiences we can enjoy, then it isn't obviously true that humans have more valuable lives compared to animals, once we take the distinct types of displeasure we can experience into account. Further, even if it is true that some human lives contain more net value than other animals, this is likely not true for all of us.

More interesting, I think, is Simmons' suggestion that even if most humans are harmed more by death than most animals, this does not undermine an equal right to life. The assumption needed to ground this claim holds that two beings have an equal right to life only if the value of life for them is equal (112). But Simmons thinks we ought to reject this assumption because it entails that all humans do not have an equal right to life. Not only would this be the case for humans with severe cognitive disabilities but, Simmons rightly notes, there are reasons to think that among paradigmatic adult humans some are harmed more by death, as "some normal, adult humans seem to have greater capacities for reflective, creative, and intellectual activity than others" (112). This is an important point often ignored in this debate. Instead, Simmons suggests that to have an equal right to life only requires that the value of life for a being meets a certain threshold of value. And this threshold, he argues, should be set to include all individuals who are subjects of a life.

Norcross takes a different approach to these questions. He draws attention to an important element related to the harm of death not addressed in the other essays: the psychological relationship between an individual and her self in the future. Norcross argues that death is worse for animals who are subjects of a life (and who have some degree of self-consciousness) because of our psychological connection to our future selves: a fact we see when you must decide between a procedure that would extend your life for two years, or one that would extend "your" life by twenty years but sever all psychological connections between your present self and the future individual. Since it is rational to prefer the first procedure, Norcross argues that what is significant about death to individuals with a personal identity over time is the effect on their well-being (as opposed to the well-being of the organism) (171).

Subjects of a life, as beings with some degree of self-consciousness, have lives that matter to them. In this respect, their death is quite different from beings who are merely sentient and lack any psychological connection to their future selves. Their death may affect the net amount of well-being in the world, but it lacks personal significance to that being, in the same way that opting for the second procedure in the example above lacks any personal significance for me. This fact, Norcross argues, can ground a preference for subjects of a life over the merely sentient when it comes to issues of life and death (174).

Part 3 turns to more practical implications of animal rights and contains a variety of interesting and unique essays. In Chapter 11, Ramona Ilea argues that the capabilities approach to animals, articulated by Nussbaum, provides a useful and rigorous way to practically apply Regan's account of animal rights to questions of public policy and the law. In Chapter 13, Robert Bass develops an argument for veganism centered on moral caution. Bass argues that if there is a reasonable chance that an action is seriously wrong and no chance that it is morally required, then we ought to avoid that action. Bass thinks meat eating meets these criteria, and presents an array of arguments that attempt to show that the more modest conclusion is that there is a substantial chance meat-eating is wrong. In Chapter 14, Jason Hanna responds to arguments that animal rights views are consistent with "therapeutic hunting" aimed at reducing the suffering and future death of overabundant species. Hanna contends that hunters and wildlife managers are not in a situation where they must override an individual's rights, and that this blunts attempts to defend therapeutic hunting.

In Chapter 12, Scott Wilson argues that many who have made moral arguments for vegetarianism have failed to appreciate the significant interest meat-eaters have in consuming meat. He makes a strong case that the interest in consuming meat cannot be reduced to an interest simply in taste or nutrition, but instead reflects and involve a much wider variety of interests, including our self-conceptions of who we are, relationships with family and friends, convenience, and a variety of symbolic meanings. Wilson contends that this ultimately undermines utilitarian arguments for vegetarianism, and shows that rights-based approaches to animals are superior.

While I think Wilson is right to highlight some of the ways in which the consumption of meat reflects more than a simple interest in taste or pleasure, it is not clear his argument actually undermines a utilitarian argument for vegetarianism. Two points can be made in response to his argument. The first concerns the plasticity of our desires. We might think, against Wilson, that many meat-eaters overestimate the effect that switching to a vegetarian lifestyle will have on their welfare. If this is the case, it is not clear that any loss they might experience is as significant as they might initially be inclined to think (many vegetarians and vegans, for example, report enjoying food just as much or nearly as much as during their omnivorous days). Second, and related to this, there is a considerable body of evidence that suggests eating a plant-based diet makes it much more likely an individual will be healthier, avoid chronic diseases, and live longer. If this is the case, individuals who adopt a vegetarian diet may experience welfare gains (even if they miss eating meat), and even if they don't appreciate this fact.

This book offers an interesting and expansive exploration of current thought on animal rights. One downside it has, however, is that none of the essays engage with more recent work on the political status of non-human animals and their place in our legal and political institutions (Ilea's essay is in this ballpark, but it doesn't address any of the recent work on the topic). This omission is understandable: the anthology grew out of a 2011 conference, and much of the emerging literature on the political status of nonhuman animals was sparked by Sue Donaldson and Will Kymlicka's (2011) Zoopolis. However, one of the volume's stated goals is to "reflect the current state of philosophical thought on the moral rights of animals" (x). The political turn that is happening in animal ethics (and among animal rights theorists) can be understood as a potential implication of the moral rights of animals (and would thus fit in Part 3). This omission leaves out a rather exciting current development in the field that is particularly relevant to advocates of the moral rights of animals.

Some of this new work, moreover, would connect the topics in Parts 2 and 3 in an interesting way. One question we might have concerns whether much hangs on questions about the comparative harm of death or claims to an equal right to life. If other animals are significantly harmed by death and have a right to life, then we might think this is all we need to see that harmful animal-use industries, like animal agriculture, must be stopped, even if humans are harmed more by death or possess a more stringent right to life.

However, if we frame our relationship to other animals in political terms, the question of the comparative harm of death may take on a new importance. If, to give just one example, we begin to look at other domesticated animals as fellow members of our political communities, then there might be additional reasons why it matters how much death harms these beings. Domesticated animals could have positive rights to things like health care, emergency services, research and development into present diseases, and the policing and investigation of crimes. How we think about these claims and their comparative strength may depend, in part, on how we think about the comparative harm of death, and whether or not humans and animals have an equal right to life. I highlight this not to fault the book for this omission, but to note how some of the more recent developments in animal ethics connect with some of the topics explored in the essays, and potentially make these questions more urgent and intriguing.

Overall, this anthology makes an excellent companion to the work of Regan, and contains a great collection of readings on current debates in the area of animal rights. It would work quite well in a class on animal ethics, and the material is suitable and accessible for undergraduates of all levels.

[1] One problem with this name is that it is misleading. The cognitive diversity that is characteristic of humans is not something that just affects those with cognitive disabilities or dementia, but all of us across our lives (when we are young, during periods of severe illness, and for many of us, as we age).