The Moral Skeptic

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Anita M. Superson, The Moral Skeptic, Oxford UP, 2009, 250pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195376616.

Reviewed by Jussi Suikkanen, University of Reading



Anita Superson’s The Moral Skeptic is an impressive book in many ways. It covers a great number of important topics in contemporary ethics in a thorough way and from a novel feminist perspective. These topics include the modern versions of Hobbesian contractarianism, the ethics of care, practical rationality, Kantian ethics, the connection between evaluative judgments and motivation, and more.

What impresses me most is that Superson manages to cover all this ground with expertise and also weave an interesting narrative thread through the whole book. That narrative is focused around the question of how we should understand and answer moral skepticism. I was less impressed by the proposed positive response to the skeptic. It was neither original nor very convincing. I’ll return to this after a summary of the book.

Before that, it should be mentioned that Superson’s book is clearly written and well structured. It furthermore uses many helpful, realistic examples to illustrate the discussed views and arguments, and their problems. Many of these examples concern the ways in which women are often wronged in ways that are overlooked by moral philosophers. Unfortunately, even if the practical concerns which these examples reflect are admirable, some of these examples are borderline sexist in their depiction of men.

In the first chapter, Superson explains the basic skeptical challenge for morality. The moral skeptic asks, ‘Why should I be moral?’ If we cannot offer any compelling reasons for the skeptic that do not merely assume that one should not do wrong actions, then it seems as if it might turn out that there is no rational requirement for the skeptic to comply with her moral obligations. Superson assumes that, in this case, morality would be somehow weaker. Its requirements would not be based on reason and rationality. She also seems to think that failing to answer the skeptic philosophically would have bad practical consequences for the oppressed groups in our society.

The second chapter argues that one traditionally influential answer to the skeptical challenge fails. That response is based on the premise that, by her own lights, the skeptic has reasons to do what is in her own interest. Contractarian theories have then tried to show that I am rationally required to act morally because this is in my self-interest. The idea is that if we all agree to restrict the way in which we pursue the satisfaction of our own desires, we will all be better off. After all, by adopting a moral disposition not to violate the rights of others, we can have beneficial co-operation instead of the costly war of all against all.

Superson’s argument against this view is that even if it could show that adopting moral dispositions is in our self-interest, this would not show that each instance of acting morally would also serve our interest. Some acts can be irrational even when they follow from rational dispositions. For all we know, many morally wrong acts could belong to this category.

Chapter 3 argues that feminist theories based on the attitude of caring equally fail to show that acting morally is always rationally required. For me, this is the best, most interesting and original chapter of the book. It gives a sense of how sophisticated the feminist debates in ethical theory have become. The different views under the umbrella of ‘ethics of care’ begin from the insight that what is fundamental in being moral is not using my reason but rather caring about other people. This requires being emotionally sensitive to others’ needs, taking care of others, being concerned about relationships, not hurting others, and so on.

At this point, some defenders of this view have refused to answer the question as to why reason would require the attitude of caring about others and acting from it. Others have argued that reason can support caring only if we do not understand rationality in terms of narrow self-interested prudentiality.

The view on which Superson mainly concentrates understands the motive of care as a natural emotion of empathy, concern, love, and solidarity. It is imprinted in us and is beyond rational assessment. However, given that we have this motive, there is an easy explanation for why acting morally from it is rationally required. This is because there is a conceptual connection between our motives and reasons for actions. The so-called internalists have argued that I have a reason for doing something if and only if I have a motive which would be served by doing that action. If we assume that we all have a motive of caring about other people, then this would imply that we all have a reason to do moral actions which would serve that motive. Thus, we have shown that acting morally is rationally required.

Superson worries that the resulting theory has sexist implications. It seems right that the motives of care, which many of us have, differ depending on our gender just because of the sexist environment in which we have grown up. Men and women often care about others in different ways. This, together with the previous internalism thesis, would mean that they would be rationally required to perform different kind of moral actions. Presumably the caring actions required from women would in this case be more demanding than the ones required from men. Given this awkward consequence, ethics of care has no appealing story to tell about what makes moral actions rationally required.

Chapter 4 concentrates more on how we should understand the position of the skeptic whose challenge the previous views failed to answer. These views assumed that a reply to the skeptic requires showing that acting morally serves her interests — either her selfish interests or her interests based on caring. However, this assumption is problematic. It cannot be that satisfying any interest whatsoever is rationally required.

It is not rational, for instance, to satisfy ‘deformed desires’. They are created in an unjust social setting, they do not benefit the agent but rather the privileged groups, they deceive the agent about this, they conflict with the agent’s own ability to pursue her well-being, and they fail to respect her own status as a person with equal intrinsic value. Much of this chapter focuses on showing that traditional informed desire tests fail to rule out such desires as irrational. A person can have a fully informed and coherent set of desires which are still deformed and thus incapable of creating reasons. As a result, Superson proposes that irrational desires should be taken to include all desires the satisfaction of which is inconsistent with the objective value of the agent herself. Deformed desires are thus irrational because they undermine my own status as an autonomous agent.

Chapter 5 begins by observing that not all immoral actions are self-interested. For instance, some of my immoral actions do not benefit me but rather benefit my privileged group whilst others are positively evil or mere emotional reactions. Some of these actions can pose a challenge when we try to explain why moral actions would be rationally required. This means that our response to the skeptic must show that all immoral actions, including the not self-interested ones, are irrational.

At this crucial point, Superson presents the traditional Kantian response to the skeptic. It is based on the claim that rationality requires coherence whereas the position of the moral skeptic is incoherent and thus irrational. This is why the skeptic too has a reason to be moral. The skeptic’s position is incoherent because she takes her own rational ability to set ends to be a source of reasons whilst she denies that the identical rational abilities of others can play the same role. To avoid incoherence and to be rational, we must not privilege ourselves or the groups we belong to but rather act in the moral ways that recognise everyone’s equal moral dignity based on their rational abilities.

The sixth chapter discusses a challenge to morality based on amoralism. The amoralist is a person who recognises that some action is wrong, judges that she thereby has a reason not to perform that action, and yet fails to be moved by this reason. This would be a potential fall-back position for the skeptic if she is forced to recognise that there are moral reasons. To fend off this challenge, the so-called internalists have tried to show that no one could be a rational amoralist.

Internalists tend to claim either that (i) I do not have a reason to do something unless I could become motivated to do that thing by deliberating from my existing motivations, or that (ii) it is conceptually true that if a rational agent judges that something is a reason she has at least some motivation to act in the corresponding way. According to Superson, the former view would let the amoralist who isn’t moved by moral considerations off the moral hook whereas the second view would commit us to indefensible, sexist assessments of irrationality with regards to certain agents. So, because the previous claims are indefensible, there can be rational amoralists who are not moved by moral reasons. Superson concludes, however, that, in the context of responding to the skeptic, this would only be a psychological problem rather than a philosophical one.

In the next chapter, we meet the motive skeptic who poses yet another challenge to morality. She acts in the way required by moral reasons but only in order to go through the motions. She lacks the motives and attitudes that we deem to be morally admirable. For her, morality is only a necessary evil. The question then is, in addition to the moral actions, can morality also rationally require us to have the right kind of moral motives?

Superson’s argument against the motive skeptic is based on the thought that the motive skeptic’s psychological make-up will necessarily be fragmented. When I think that some act is wrong, I must recognise that it is wrong for a reason. Yet, if I lack the moral motives, then I am not moved by these reasons and to that extent I am conflicted. Furthermore, as Aristotle claimed, acting in the virtuous ways often leads to acquiring the corresponding virtuous motivations. If the motive skeptic wants to remain as she is, she will need to try to stop this psychological process. It is difficult to see what could rationalise this effort.

The last chapter defends what Superson calls the ‘interdependency thesis’. According to this thesis, we should assess the rationality of agents and their dispositions, maxims, motives, and actions together. The rationality of this whole package (and its parts) ultimately consists of coherence between the different elements. Our actions must reflect our motives; our motives must reflect our practical dispositions, which require having a variety of practical beliefs and attitudes; our dispositions, motives, maxims, and actions must all mesh with the moral theory and principles that we accept and the reasons for which we accept them.

If all of this unity is in place, then I satisfy all the requirements of rationality. In this case, I have integrity. Given that immoral motives and actions would allegedly require incoherent beliefs about the value of different persons, I will also be moral if I have integrity. This means that the rational requirement to be moral is based on the requirement to be coherent. Furthermore, given that having a coherent psychology is bound to require higher-order reflection about my practical attitudes and my character, the moral life will also be a self-reflective life.

Even though Superson’s book contains many interesting insights and arguments on different topics that would be worth discussing, I want to end by explaining why I think her admirable project ultimately fails.

Superson argues that we should not think that the moral skeptic can only recognise rational requirements based on her self-interests. Rather, the skeptic is willing to accept any reasons whatsoever if only we can provide a strong enough argument for them. However, Superson then seems to assume that if not all requirements of rationality are based on self-interests, then the rest of them must be based on the requirement to be coherent (this is understandable given that the best argument I can give for my view is to show that the conflicting view is incoherent). Thus, the only source of moral reasons we can use in our response to the skeptic is the potential incoherence of persons who are not moral.

The problem is that if coherence is the only available resource for our response to the skeptic, an adequate response to the moral skeptic becomes impossible for two reasons. Firstly, it is doubtful whether I must be incoherent if I am immoral. Let us accept that in setting my own ends, my ability to make rational choices makes the objects of my choices worthy of being pursued. As a result, if I think that anything is worthy of being pursued, I must consider my own rationality as an end in itself. Perhaps, for the sake of consistency, I must therefore also consider your identical ability to rationally choose as an end in itself and as something that can make things worth of being pursued.

However, do I fail to treat you as an end if I act selfishly and fail to assist you in the pursuance of your ends (as morality occasionally requires)? No I don’t. For I am only committed to treating my own rationality as an end in the sense that I must take its objects as reason-providing for me. In order to be coherent, I probably must treat your rationality as an end in the very same sense; I must take your rational willing to be a source of reasons for you. In this sense, egoism is consistently universalisable.

In this situation, I fail to see how the morally skeptical egoistic position would be irrational or even partial, as Superson claims. She never quite shows why universal egoism would be partial (after all, such a position accepts that all persons have equal dignity insofar as their rational willing is a source of reasons for them), or why partiality would necessarily be incoherent (given that it is, after all, universalisable).

Secondly, locating the ultimate source of rational requirements for being moral in my own coherent psychological make-up seems far too self-centred in a morally offensive way. On this view, so long as I remain coherent when acting immorally, my faculty of reason can say nothing against my immoral actions. Never mind the suffering of the other people; as long as our psychological make-up is self-reflectively consistent everything will be kosher. If this were right, the question would be what’s so important about satisfying the demands of reason in the first place? If all rational requirements for being moral came from within us as agents, then perhaps morality would be better felt than judged.