The Moral Target: Aiming at Right Conduct in War and Other Conflicts

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F. M. Kamm, The Moral Target: Aiming at Right Conduct in War and Other Conflicts, Oxford University Press, 2012, 288pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199897520.

Reviewed by Cecile Fabre, Lincoln College, Oxford


The Moral Target gathers a number of Kamm's essays on the ethics of killing and the ethics of war -- four of which (out of 10) have not been published elsewhere. The essays are organised according to the chronology of war: the first chapter deals with the connection between the ethics of starting a war and the ethics of ending it; chapters 2 to 4 tackle the ethics of killing in war and examine closely the role which the doctrine of double effect is standardly thought to play in justifying such killings. Chapter 5 also pertains to individuals' conduct in war but focuses on an issue that is almost entirely overlooked in the literature, to wit, the ethics of collaborating with the enemy. Contrastingly, chapters 6 and 7 deal with the morality of post-war settlements, also known as the jus post bellum, whereas chapters 8 and 9 broach non-traditional forms of conflict, such as terrorism and resistance to oppression. The final chapter, unlike its predecessors, deals with possible, rather than actual, threats of harm, and brings Kamm's views on the doctrine of double effect to bear on controversies surrounding nuclear deterrence.

It is impossible to do justice, within the scope of a short review, to the breadth and depths of these papers. I should like to concentrate on an issue which recurs at various points in the book, namely the extent to and grounds upon which special relationships (for example of co-citizenship, or familiar relationships) dictate who may do what to whom in war.Kamm focuses on two dimensions of the issue: (a) whether or not one may collaborate with a wrongdoer (in her example, with the Nazis) for the sake of protecting one's associates; (b) whether a government is permitted, indeed is under a duty, to give priority to its own members, in particular its noncombatants, over enemies and neutrals.

Question (a), which Kamm tackles in chapter 5, is germane to the well-known question of harming a few to save many, but the focus on Jewish collaborators (whose acts of collaboration she compares and contrasts with ordinary Germans' similar acts) raises interesting issues of group loyalty which have been relatively ignored in the ethics of war.[1]Some Jewish victims of Nazism were either asked, or indeed sometimes volunteered, to collaborate with the Nazis by selecting who would be sent to concentration camps. By cooperating, they contributed to the deaths of some fellow Jews. Were they permitted to do so on the grounds that they thereby saved a greater number of putative victims? Kamm argues that we must distinguish the case where the Nazis would not have killed as many victims had it not been for the help provided by Jews, and the case where they would have done so anyway. In the first case, Kamm claims that collaboration is impermissible; in the second case, whether it is permissible depends on (inter alia) whether the collaborators had the authority to do so on behalf of their own people. I have some concerns about both claims. Suppose that (in a given occupied town or country) a Jewish mother is asked to help the local Gestapo select 40 Jews for the next convoy. She (somehow) knows that without her help, they will (somehow) only be able to select 35. But they tell her that if she refuses to help, they will select her son as one of the 35; if she agrees to help, he will be spared. She thus has to choose between saving five nonfamily though fellow group members from death, and her own son. In this conflict of loyalties, it is not clear to me that she ought not to collaborate.

Let us now accept that the Nazis would succeed in killing as many people without this particular selector, and that the latter is able to minimise the number of deaths overall by collaborating. I agree with Kamm that one may select on the basis of likelihood of survival in the ghetto (p. 118), or of agents' contributions to the welfare of fellow Jews (p.120). I also agree that whether one seeks opportunities to collaborate or accepts offers to do so under duress makes a difference to the moral status of one's collaborative acts (p. 129). Finally, I agree that whether one has the authority to select people for death convoys matters. By authority, I do not mean 'being permitted', which is one of the ways in which Kamm sometimes and somewhat confusingly uses the word (see p. 124-126). Rather, I mean 'standing' or, as lawyers might say, 'competence'. And on this particular count, the case of Jewish collaborators differs from that of German collaborators. For one might think that, as members of the victim groups, and thus as victims themselves, Jewish selectors are in a position to make such choices on behalf of their associates whereas outsiders would not. Kamm notes that if each member of the victimised group consented to a subset of the group making selecting decisions on behalf of the group, this would give selectors the authority so to act (p. 126).

But this is tantamount to making the conferral of that authority conditional upon the explicit and unanimous consent of all putative victims. This seems too demanding. For a start, it would not confer on selectors the authority to select those who are not in a position to consent for reasons (the mentally disabled, the very young, etc.) which also suggests that their chances of survival outside the ghettos are so low anyway as to provide a reason for selecting them (thereby improving the survival prospects of others.) Moreover, securing such consent under the conditions of a ghetto is extraordinarily difficult. Finally, if the authority to select for death in this case were to depend on explicit and unanimous consent, it would seem that no state would have the authority to expose its citizens to death unless the latter would similarly consent to it. This would make almost all wars unjust. Pacifists would undoubtedly welcome this conclusion; proponents of the view that war is sometimes just, of whom Kamm is one, ought to find it worrisome.

This brings me to the second dimension of the issue of special relationships in war. It is standardly assumed that a state is permitted to, indeed must, give priority to its members over outsiders, when waging war. Kamm herself endorses that view, in chapter 3, on (mostly) two grounds. First, a just state has a general duty of care to its own members (p. 59). Second, in just the same way an individual is entitled to give priority to herself over others, so can a state give priority to its own members over outsiders (p. 60.) The second argument strikes me as much stronger than the first. Note, as a preliminary point, that it remains an open question whether unjust states may so act. If they may not, then this would considerably narrow the range of permissible war time conduct and thus of just wars, since unjust states would have to give exactly the same weight, other things relatively equal, to the welfare of their members and to that of outsiders, notably enemy noncombatants. Perhaps that conclusion is to be welcome.

Note, too, that the first argument would not protect from harm stateless noncombatants, who do not enjoy the benefits of state protection. More problematically still, on what I take to be the most plausible account of state authority, the rights, duties and privileges of state officials flow from, and supervene on, the rights, duties and privileges of their own members. In order to ascertain whether a state has a duty of care to its own members, such as to warrant giving priority to their fundamental interests in the conduct of war, we must thus ascertain whether members of a political community have that duty qua such members vis-à-vis one another. As a cosmopolitan, who takes the view that political borders are irrelevant to the conferral of fundamental entitlements and their correlative obligations, I am inclined to think that there is no such thing as a special duty of care towards one's compatriots qua compatriots.[2] But I also think that, as per Kamm's second argument, agents are entitled to confer greater weight on their own rights than on the rights of strangers -- including rights that they hold jointly with others, of which political rights are a paradigmatic examples. If I am correct, then patriotic partiality at best confers a permission on states to give priority to their members, but not a duty to do so. Incidentally, Kamm believes that a belligerent waging a just war must confer higher weight on the lives of neutral noncombatants than on the lives of enemy innocent noncombatants, precisely because the latter's state has acted unjustly. Those who believe that political borders are largely irrelevant to matters of life and death will resist this conclusion: if those enemy noncombatants are genuinely innocent of their state's wrongdoing, then they stand in exactly the same relationship vis-à-vis the just belligerent as neutrals.

It should not be assumed that Kamm regards states' duty of care to their members as always overriding. On the contrary, she believes that in some cases states may expose their own citizens to the harms of war, not simply foreseeably but also (in some cases) intentionally. If the war is just, then states may so act for the good of their citizenry; if, on the contrary, a state has started an unjust war, then it may, indeed is under a duty to expose its citizens to further lethal harm as a means to redress the injustice it has committed against its enemy (pp. 64ff). On the first count, it would seem that a state would thus be permitted deliberately to inflict mild punishment on some innocent citizens if (provided it could do so without ever being found out) this were the only way to promote the collective good. Perhaps one should find that implication worrisome. On the second count, while I agree that a state may harm its innocent citizens in the course of rectifying a past injustice, unlike Kamm I believe that, precisely in so far as they are innocent and thus have not forfeited their right not to be harmed, those citizens are not liable to being harmed, indeed are wronged (albeit justifiably) by their state's actions. The difference is not just a matter of semantics, since it would give those citizens some grounds upon which to claim compensation.

These are just a few remarks on some of Kamm's views on war that are less familiar to most readers, perhaps, than her views on (e.g.) the doctrine of double effect. To those familiar with Kamm's work, this timely collection of essays brings together some of her best known recent writings on the topic as well as new material on emerging issues in just war theory. To those not familiar with it, it provides a wonderful opportunity to enjoy her unrivalled argumentative skills and her superb handling of hypothetical cases. Reading Kamm's work is arduous, and wonderfully rewarding. Every sentence counts, every paragraph is a building block in a carefully constructed argument, and it is necessary to see each of those small elements in order to bring the whole edifice into view. At the same time, making that investment does pay, if only because (in this book as in all her other works) one gets a sense not just of a great mind at work on morally urgent issues, but of a profoundly honest mind too. Kamm has that rare quality, in great evidence here, of being willing to say, quite simply, that at crucial junctures she does not have answers but is merely hoping to raise some questions. Often, one cannot do much more than that. To do it well, however, and in a way that is genuinely illuminating, is not easy. This book does it superbly well.


Fabre, Cécile. (2012). Cosmopolitan War, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Goodin, R. E. and Lepora, Chiara (forthcoming, 2013). On Complicity and Compromise, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

[1] For an illuminating treatment of complicity with wrongdoing in violent conflicts, see Goodin and Lepora forthcoming, 2013.

[2] I argue to that effect in Fabre 2012.