The Morality of Embryo Use

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Louis M. Guenin, The Morality of Embryo Use, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 273pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521694278.

Reviewed by Alfonso Gómez-Lobo, Georgetown University/Catholic University of Chile


This book enters the bioethical fray on the side of those who favor embryo use for humanitarian ends. Its specific originality lies in the claim that "its argument in chief commands assent even within the most prominent comprehensive views presumed to oppose embryo use" (p. 4). Among the latter the author includes Kantian morality and the magisterium of the Catholic Church (pp. 149-170).

In order to carry out this truly ambitious project, the book first provides a good summary of the basic biological and metaphysical information that will be appealed to. Then the set of "epidosembryos" is defined (they are embryos generated in vitro whose progenitors have donated them for medical research with a prohibition on their implantation). An argument is then developed to prove that it is not only permissible to use those embryos solely as means, but that "such use lies within the mandate of a collective duty" (p. 4). The argument itself (called by the author "the argument from nonenablement") is presented in section 2.3. Later chapters in which individuation, respect for specific life, clones and other alternatives are discussed refer back to it as the cornerstone upon which everything else is built. Likewise when explaining why Kantian morality and Catholicism "should be understood as members of a consensus supporting epidosembryo use" (p. 58), the crucial appeal is once more to the argument from nonenablement. It is fair to say that the book stands or falls with this argument. The rest of the book, while interesting in itself, is to a large extent secondary for an evaluation of the central claims of the work. It is quite remarkable however that although most authors who justify lethal embryo use buttress their case by holding that an early embryo cannot be an individual, and a fortiori a person, Guenin argues extensively (pp. 59-98) against denying human individuality to early embryos.

In order to make sense of the argument from nonenablement one should advance some conjectures about its conceptual context. It seems to me that the background assumption in ethics within which the author works is a strong form of preference utilitarianism (pp. 10-20). In metaphysics the author seems to be open to a form of dualism according to which a human body and a (possible) corresponding human person are two distinct things (pp. 25-27).

The utilitarian assumption is manifest in the over-all structure of the argument. The ultimate reason to think that it is morally permissible to destroy ("sacrifice" is the preferred term) human embryos is provided by the expected consequences (which are formulated in moving terms: "the relief of suffering," "the most effective therapeutic advances in modern history," "service of humanitarian ends," etc.). The author is well aware that there are serious objections to any consequentialistic justification of destructive actions and he mentions what he takes to be two lines of opposition: (a) Duty of Noninterference and (b) Zygotic Personhood (p. 26). The convoluted formulations of those positions are worth quoting verbatim. (a) "In respect of any being to which corresponds a possible person, there obtains a duty pro tanto not to interfere with any current process of development that in circumstances such as the circumstances of such being results in a person or in an organism constituting the body of a person." (b) "An embryo and any developmental successor thereof is a person for purposes of the duty not to harm and duty not to kill."

Strangely enough, the author calls the second claim a "deontic precept." But surely upholders of zygotic personhood hold that their claim that an embryo is a person is a factual claim about its nature. The deontic precept is derivative. In fact, Guenin's Duty of Noninterference would probably be formulated by opponents of embryo use in much simpler terms as a duty not to kill persons and therefore would not be applied independently of the assertion of zygotic personhood. They would also reject Guenin's claim that "[a] normative sense of 'person' is always relative to a purpose" (p. 11) on the grounds that it suggests that the truth or falsehood of the assertion that a given individual is a person depends always on prior human ends.

The argument from nonenablement, which, as we saw, is the cornerstone of the book, relies heavily on claims that follow from prior contingent human actions. As summarized by the author it reads thus: "Permissibility of epidosembryo use follows from the embryo's presently bounded developmental potential and the end to be served by using the embryo" (p. 53). The fact that "the developmental potential" of an embryo is "bounded" is what makes it a"nonenabled" embryo. Its "potential" being "bounded" follows from a key clause in the definition of epidosembryos: the progenitors not only have refused transfer of the embryos into their genetic mothers, they have also added a strict prohibition on implantation into any other woman or into an artificial uterus (p. 27). Clearly, a human decision is assumed to explain the absence of a property which is crucial for the moral judgment concerning how the organisms under consideration ought to be treated.

Consider the following case: a little girl is born and her parents decide not to feed her. They also issue a strict prohibition on others feeding her. Their decision would make her a "nonenabled" infant with no "developmental potential." Except for a few defenders of infanticide, most people would consider this outrageous. Since that little girl was earlier an individual embryo, it is clear that Guenin needs some supplementary argumentation to have a plausible case. In contrast with the generally acknowledged duty to feed a child, he argues that it is permissible to decline intrauterine transfer. The reason for this is that there is no duty to rescue an embryo from the risk of death, ultimately because, it is alleged, an embryo cannot be harmed.

The notion of harm (in addition to the notion of "potential") ends up being the main source of weakness in the argument from nonenablement. It has become standard to require desires and consciousness as conditions for harm, but it is possible to marshal counterexamples involving harms that do not require desires (e.g. having property stolen that one owns but does not desire to own) or consciousness (e.g. being deprived of one's reputation by slander behind one's back). To be harmed is better understood as being deprived of a good, whether one is aware of it or not. Much of this calls for more qualification, but it suffices to buttress the common-sense view that loss of life caused by intentional deprivation of the conditions to survive harms, without distinction, an adult, an infant or an embryo. The further question, whether it is morally permissible or impermissible to cause that deprivation, depends on the prior question of infant and zygotic personhood.

On zygotic personhood Guenin writes the following:

Thus one cannot accomplish anything, for anyone, by asserting that an embryo as to which progenitors refuse intrauterine transfer, and that they wish to give to medicine, is a person for purposes of the duty not to harm or not to kill. Once progenitors have barred an embryo from the womb, its developmental potential is bounded such that the foregoing situation will not change. (p. 46)

I find this utterly perplexing. Whether an embryo or an infant is a person surely does not depend on the decision not to nurture him or her, and even less so on whether something can be accomplished by asserting it. Part of the confusion is due to Guenin's decisionistic notion of personhood in the normative sense ("Personhood is conferred when someone chooses to accord a being some treatment" p. 165). But if the choice to treat something respectfully is not to be purely arbitrary there must be in that being some properties that rationally justify the attitude of respect. They have been traditionally acknowledged by calling such a being "a person" (p. 17). Both in the philosophical tradition and in ordinary language the descriptive and the normative sense of the predicate "person" are analytically linked to each other. Thus, in principle, personhood can be objectively ascertained. It is not something we may choose to grant or withhold at will.

The author seems to accept some of this in what he takes to be the clinching argument against the Catholic magisterium:

The magisterium seems to contradict Zygotic Personhood when, echoing Boethius on 'what a human person is and should be,' it writes as follows: "Constituted by a rational nature, man is a personal subject capable of reflecting on himself and of determining his acts".

Guenin then adds what sounds like the final, deadly blow: "Embryos are not rational, self-conscious, or autonomous" (p. 170).

I suggest analyzing the foregoing argument as follows. If we see someone displaying rationality, reflecting on herself, choosing in unpredictable ways, etc., we would all agree that we are in front of a person. This is a factual claim based on the observable evidence, independently of any purpose we might have in mind. We would all agree, furthermore, that we are in front of an adult person, a human being fully actualizing her capabilities or potentialities. When she was a child or an infant or an embryo, she had these capabilities, but they were not yet actualized. If she did not have them at those earlier stages, she would have undergone a substantial change into a different kind of substance, and this would be, as Guenin says, "to countenance as a metaphysical possibility that a protean substance survives a metamorphosis that defies the laws of nature" (p. 22). A human embryo, then, cannot become a person. It would defy the laws of nature for her to turn into something completely different from what she was. She can become an adult or mature person because she is already not a potential person, but a person some of whose specific potentialities are not yet fully activated. Genetically well-formed human embryos are indeed rational, self-conscious and autonomous potentially. They are endowed with the genetic information leading to the development of organs that sustain those activities. Feline embryos are not.

The genetic potentiality of human embryos has little to do with what Guenin calls the "developmental potential" that results from the decision not to properly nurture them. A well-argued metaphysical notion of potentiality based on the genetic evidence, in my view, would establish zygotic personhood and its deontic consequences, chief among these that no human embryos should be intentionally dismembered and killed. It is true that they are going to die anyway, but so are we. Perhaps the deepest lesson to be obtained from this learned book is "that to create an embryo outside the body is to place the embryo in peril ab initio" (p. 35).