The Moving Spotlight: An Essay on Time and Ontology

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Ross P. Cameron, The Moving Spotlight: An Essay on Time and Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2015, 219pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713296.

Reviewed by Meghan Sullivan, University of Notre Dame


Moving spotlight theory is finally getting its time in the, er, spotlight. It's long been treated as the one of the most obscure theories of temporal passage, combining the least commonsensical consequence of the B-theory (eternalism) with the most scientifically problematic consequence of the A-theories (the privileged present). But in the space of five years there have been numerous articles and two book-length projects offering sophisticated variants of spotlight theories and defending their coherence and usefulness. Ross P. Cameron has written one such book -- the other is from Bradford Skow -- and Cameron is arguably one of the most sincere defenders of the project[1]

The Moving Spotlight is a pitch to A-theorists to take a version of the spotlight seriously. In Chapter 1, Cameron describes his audience as those who endorse two claims about the passage of time:

1. The Privileged Present: There is a unique objectively privileged time: the time which is present. No description of reality can be correct and complete without specifying which time is present. (2)

2. Temporary Presentness: What time is objectively privileged changes: the time that is objectively present either was or will not be present (or both), and some time that is not objectively present either was or will be (or both). (2)

B-theorists, on Cameron's definition, deny one or both of these claims about presentness and passage. As he notes, this is by no means an uncontroversial way of drawing the distinction between A and B theories. Some A-theorists may be uncomfortable quantifying over times. Others think the debate is one about whether "tense'' is a part of reality.[2] Still others think the debate is best characterized as one about what kind of change there is in the world -- is there any kind of change that is not reducible to mere variation in a spacetime manifold?[3]

I admit, I am partial to the last suggestion, because I think it describes the debate's borders precisely, without any explicit commitment to times existing or a property of "presentness''. It also casts a broader net, accommodating views like fragmentalism that seem A-theoretic but do not think times change in the way Cameron describes. That said, Cameron does an admirable job of making precise a debate that is often left as mere metaphor. His book is a model for how to theorize about temporal ontology in a rigorous and productive way.

We members of the "A-Team'' want to send our best theory into the ring against the B-theorists. For the past eighty years or so, the consensus has been that the most competitive version of the A-theory is presentism. Presentists add another assumption to the A-theory package: everything that exists is located at the present moment. So in addition to change in what time is present, there is also change in what exists. Sensible presentists deny there are any merely past or merely future objects.

But this added ontological assumption comes with costs. Presentists need to make sense of why there seem to be truths about merely past and future existents, even if, strictly speaking, they don't exist. Presentists have trouble finding a way to state their temporary existence assumption in a rigorous way without falling into logical contradiction with their other commitments. Presentists lack all of the past and future points of spacetime that seem indispensible to our best physical theories.

Hence we find the renewed interest in eternalist or "spotlight'' A-theories. All of the spotlight theories agree on two assumptions. Everything that ever existed, exists, or will exist exists eternally. And some kind of change is, was, or will not be reducible to mere variation in a spacetime manifold. Then they fill in their pictures of ontology and passage in different ways. Here is a user guide to some common spotlight theories, in case you are unfamiliar with the terrain.

Classical Spotlighters believe everything is eternally concrete and eternally located in some regions of a spread out spacetime manifold. Presentness "passes over'' regions of the manifold, and at any given time only one region is "lit up'' with the property of presentness. Objects persist through time by having temporal parts in the manifold and all of their properties (other than being present) are had relative to these temporal parts. Something is not present if it does not have a part located at the time lit as present. Classical Spotlighters basically take the traditional B-theory picture and add one more element to it -- a sweeping property of presentness. The view was articulated by C.D. Broad, but it has not found many defenders. Broad himself thought the view is an intriguing metaphor that explains nothing.[4]

Cameron pitches his alternative spotlight theory as akin to "enriched presentism''. Everything always exists, and everything (now) is eternally a certain way. Further, everything has what he calls temporal distributional properties -- intrinsic properties that describe how an object is was or will be at every age the object has. (140) For a simple example, I have the distributional property of being -- at age 33 -- such that I am a philosopher and was a child twenty years ago and will be a retiree in forty years and . . . . On Cameron's view, individual objects endure through change; they do not have temporal parts spread out in a spacetime manifold. And they change age properties over time -- for instance, in December I will be 34. But objects never change these distributional properties. And they never change with respect to where they are located in space and time, their existence, their concreteness or their essential properties. (149) If something is essentially human or concrete, it is also eternally these ways. Cameron's distributional properties supply the truthmakers for claims about the past, without falling prey to a version of McTaggart's paradox that usually subdues spotlight theories. More on that in a moment.

If we want a metaphor to pick out Cameron's view, we might call it a "dragging spotlight view'', since as the passage of time progresses, it drags new ages to objects, who then change their intrinsic properties (since these temporal distributional properties assure us that new ages mean new present intrinsic properties). There is a great deal more property change on Cameron's spotlight theory than on the classical version.

Two other spotlight theories deserve mention, since they compete with Cameron's theory. Minimal A-theorists think that past and future objects exist, but they do not have any spatiotemporal location. What appears to be ontological change is really just objects losing properties like concreteness and spatiotemporal location. Everything eternally exists, but existence is more lightweight than on Cameron's eternalism -- these merely past or future existents don't have any interesting present intrinsic properties.[5]

Fragmentalists think that there are many points/regions of spacetime, each with their own present and own frame for evaluating tensed facts. On this view, there are many spotlights, each shining on its own fragment of spacetime.[6] In Objective Becoming, Skow proposes (though ultimately does not endorse) a theory similar to this to help A-theorists square their commitments with relativity.

This gets confusing, so I made a chart to help keep some of the key choice points straight.

Guide to Spotlights:


Endurantist or Perdurantist?

Account of Property Change?

How Much Spacetime Manifold?

Classical Spotlight


Only the spotlight changes A-theoretically. Everything else is mere variation in the manifold.

One big concrete manifold.

Cameron Spotlight


Objects age and the world changes how things are intrinsically. But nothing changes distributional properties, essential properties, concreteness or spacetime location.

One big concrete manifold.

Minimal A-Theory


Objects change from concrete to non-concrete, gain and lose temporal location simpliciter, and gain and lose properties that entail concreteness or location.

No concrete manifold.



Object can have incompatible properties, in the sense that incompatible facts can describe reality at different spacetime points.

Many unjoined concrete spacetime points.

With this taxonomy in mind, Cameron's book raises two questions of interest to philosophers of time: Should A-theorists be eternalists? And if so, which of the spotlight theories should we choose? Here is how he settles the questions.

In Chapter 1, Cameron defends spotlighters against the charge that on their view, we could never know whether we are in the present moment. He argues that we face a choice between using strict internalist standards for knowledge or more permissive externalist standards. On the strict internalist standard, every A-theorist (presentist, spotlighter or otherwise) faces a skeptical puzzle about knowing she is present. On the externalist standard, every A-theory can solve the skeptical challenge. Cameron favors a particular version of the externalist strategy: we can know we are present because (i) our presentness is entailed by the best A-theory of time, (ii) that theory is the best option we have given all the considerations that figure into our theory choice, and (iii) the world "cooperates'' with our best theory. (37) One weird feature of this solution is that anyone who hasn't entertained and chosen an A-theory of time is not in a position to know that she is present. Hence, if you are concerned to save the masses from skepticism about their presentness, you should teach them some A-theoretic metaphysics.

Chapter 2 tackles a version of McTaggart's paradox for how events could change from present to past. Here Cameron's methodological commitments come to the fore. Cameron thinks any adequate A-theory will make sense of the truthmaker intuition: true claims are true in virtue of how reality is. How do we find truthmakers for true claims about the past? On the surface, it seems a commitment to truthmakers motivates spotlighters to claim that if something was the case, then it is the case in the past. But this generates a paradox. Events that serve as the truthmakers for past truths are in the past. But they are also present enough to serve as the truthmakers. And no event is both past and present.

Cameron wiggles out of this version of McTaggart's paradox by denying the assumption that if something was the case then it is the case in the past. He takes pains in Chapter 3 to clarify what a commitment to truthmakers consists in, namely: "the fundamental account of the world consists in simply specifying the ontological inventory, and every other truth about how things are is true in virtue of the ontological inventory being as it is.'' (117) It does not require that past events both be in the past and be present truthmakers.

In Chapter 4, Cameron describes his version of the spotlight. He motivates his theory of temporal distributional properties and defends it from objections. Then he argues that his version of the spotlight theory provides an adequate ontological foundation for truths about the past and future, while doing justice to the A-theory motivations of explaining passage and all of the robust intrinsic change in the world.

In Chapter 5, he joins this project with another of his long-standing research programs -- -providing an ontology that explains our intuition that the future is "open'' while preserving bivalence and honoring his methodological commitment to truthmakers. He treats openness as a form of metaphysical indeterminacy. He argues that this understanding of openness is perfectly compatible with eternalism. Readers interested in this debate would do well to consult his earlier work with Elizabeth Barnes on the topic.[8]

Has Cameron built a better spotlight? There are two points where I struggled to identify with his motivations.

First, why is he so committed to past and future objects having location and concreteness? If all the spotlighter ultimately wants is enough "ontological inventory'' to serve as the truthmakers for tensed truths, why build in these extra assumptions about their natures? Cameron never supplies arguments for these choices in his theory. Instead, he draws the line against minimal A-theories: "this ontology, to my mind, is far less attractive . . . If the choice is between admitting the existence of dinosaurs in the past or admitting the existence of mere logical existents that used to be dinosaurs that exist now but don't exist anywhere, I'll take the former.'' (147) This is odd because Cameron claims to model his spotlight view on enriched presentism -- taking seriously the presentists' objections to the B-theory picture of change. One of the key presentist objections to the B-theory is the notion that there is this real, concrete manifold with dinosaurs still existing concretely in the past, still being reptiles and so on.

Second, why think the only methodological options in this debate are to choose between a truthmaking project and an ideological project (Chapter 3)? Cameron offers some interesting arguments against the currently popular ideological project, which holds that a theory of temporal ontology should give a metaphysical semantics for tensed truths. He insists that a theory will be satisfactory if it just gives a complete account of truthmakers. Once you've "fixed where things are and how they are intrinsically'', you have discharged your truthmaker duty. (130) Developing this account leads him to defend the coherence of temporal distributional properties. But this theory of properties is a serious cost to his theory. For example, Cameron's account of properties entails that something can be concrete now (because it is essentially concrete), but have no mass, height, or shape now (because it is past). (149)

There is a third methodological option that Cameron does not consider: all the A-theorist owes us is a theory that renders the main A-theoretic commitments consistent with our best scientific evidence about time and as much commonsense as we can salvage. If this extra commitment to finding truthmakers forces us to a very strange view of properties, perhaps we should abandon it. And, at the very least, we need not require that A-theorists have a view about what the fundamental truthmakers are or what makes a property intrinsic. To be an A-theorist is just to think there is a fundamental distinction between the past, present and future.

These complaints aside, The Moving Spotlight is a novel, plausible, and rigorous contribution to our understanding of the A-theories. It deserves the careful attention of any scholar working on time, ontology, or the methodology of metaphysics.

[1] See Skow, Bradford. Objective Becoming. (Oxford University Press, 2015)

[2] Sider, Theodore. Writing the Book of the World. (Oxford University Press, 2011) Chapter 11. Prior, A.N. and Kit Fine. Worlds, Times and Selves. (University of Massachusetts Press, 1977). p.32.

[3] Sullivan, Meghan. "An A-Theory Without Tense Operators.'' Canadian Journal of Philosophy. (Forthcoming)

[4] Broad, C.D. Scientific Thought. (Keegan Paul, 1923).

[5] Sullivan, Meghan. "The Minimal A-Theory.'' Philosophical Studies. 2012. 158: 149-174.

[6] Introduced in Fine, Kit. "Tense and Reality.'' in Modality and Tense: Philosophical Papers. (Oxford University Press, 2005). pp. 261-320.

[7] At least on Skow's gloss.

[8] Barnes, Elizabeth and Ross Cameron. "The Open Future: Bivalence, Determinism, and Ontology.'' Philosophical Studies. 146 (2) 291-309.