The Multiple Realization Book

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Thomas W. Polger and Lawrence A. Shapiro, The Multiple Realization Book, Oxford University Press, 2016, 258pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780198779896.

Reviewed by Janet Levin, University of Southern California


This is an interesting and provocative book. It brings together work that Thomas W. Polger and Lawrence A. Shapiro have been doing since 2000, both jointly and individually, to clarify (and criticize) the contention that mental states are multiply realized (or at least multiply realizable) by different types of physical states.

The thesis that mental states are multiply realized was initially proposed as an objection to the type-identity theory (introduced mid- 20th century by U.T. Place, J.J.C. Smart, and Herbert Feigl), which holds that each type of mental state (or at least each type of sensation) is identical with some type of neural state or process, e.g. 'pain = C-fiber stimulation'. Although many theorists at the time objected to the type-identity theory on logical or conceptual grounds, others, most notably Hilary Putnam and Jerry Fodor, suggested that there are empirical reasons to reject it.

In particular, Putnam argued that there exist psychological similarities, but significant neural dissimilarities, among creatures such as humans, other mammals, octopuses and (hypothetical) silicon-based Martians, and thus that one should reject the type-identity theory in favor of functionalism, the view that mental states are second-order states, characterized by the roles they play in a psychological system, that can be instantiated, or "realized", by different types of physical states in different systems. In a related argument against the type-identity theory, Fodor maintained that, even if there are few extant cases of multiple realization, the laws of psychology can be sufficiently general only if it is possible for them to be instantiated by creatures with different types of physical states and processes, and therefore the multiple realizability of mental states is required for the explanatory adequacy (or autonomy) of psychology. (Indeed, some argue that the phenomenon of "neural plasticity" -- in which different neural structures can be recruited to perform psychological functions normally performed by other neural states -- demonstrates the possibility that a type of mental state can be realized by different neural states even in a single individual at different times.)

Early in the book, Polger and Shapiro state that their goal is to rebut the empirical arguments for multiple realization, and they set out to challenge both the "first wave" empirical arguments against the type-identity theory by early functionalists such as Putnam and Fodor, and also some more recent "second wave" arguments that are informed by specific findings in the neurosciences. (They are not interested in addressing the logical or conceptual arguments against the type-identity theory. As they put it (p. 57), 'stories about Commander Data are not data'.)

The book is divided into three parts. In Part I, Polger and Shapiro discuss some of the early arguments for functionalism (and against the type-identity theory) by Putnam and Fodor. In addition, they provide a substantive characterization of what multiple realization must be to stand as a genuine alternative to the type-identity theory. First they characterize realization as a relation between a second-order state or property (the having of some function) and the first-order state that has that function in some system, and go on to contend that the mere existence of physical differences among those first-order realizers is not by itself evidence that the second-order state is multiply realized. The differences, they contend, have to be relevant differences, and they propose (p. 67) an "Official Recipe" for when such differences occur, namely, that (for lower-level states of types A and B):

(i) As and Bs are of the same kind in model or taxonomic system S1.
(ii) As and Bs are of different kinds in model or taxonomic system S2.
(iii) The factors that lead the As and Bs to be differently classified by S2 must be among those that lead them to be commonly classified by S1.
(iv) The relevant S2 variation between As and Bs must be distinct from the S1 intra-kind variation between As and Bs.

Polger and Shapiro use their signature example of a corkscrew to illustrate their point. To be a corkscrew, they observe (p. 64), is to be an artifact that has a specific function: the capacity to remove corks from bottles by twisting a screw into the cork and applying opposing forces to cork and bottle to pull out the cork. Moreover, they observe, there are many differences among corkscrews: some are waiters' (hinged single lever) corkscrews, others have double levers -- and corkscrews can be made of different materials such as aluminum or steel.

The difference between waiters' and double lever corkscrews is, on their view, a lower-level (S2) difference in features that permits both types of device to count as corkscrews (that is, to belong to S1) -- and is also a difference distinct from the intra-kind differences among instances of each type of corkscrew. So corkscrews can be multiply realized by waiters' and double lever devices. On the other hand, being made of aluminum versus steel would not be the relevant kind of difference, since these differences can occur among different instances of each lower-level type of corkscrew. The question, therefore, is whether the relation between the different types of neural states that realize the same mental state is more like the relation between waiters' and double lever corkscrews or between corkscrews made of aluminum and steel.

In Part II, Polger and Shapiro address this question and evaluate the empirical evidence for both (actual) multiple realization and the potential for multiple realizability. They argue, first, that multiple realization is less prevalent than initially suggested by philosophers such as Putnam, in part because the physical differences between humans and, for example, octopuses are accompanied by functional differences between the species as well -- and so these are not genuine cases of psychological similarity and physical difference.

Moreover, they argue that, given more empirically realistic individuation conditions for types of neural states, the type-identity theory is compatible with there being a variety of physical differences between the neural states of creatures that nonetheless all realize the same mental state. The differences that loom so large in the early challenges to the type-identity theory, they argue, are more like individual differences within a single kind of corkscrew, and thus these differences may not present genuine counterexamples. In general, they argue, attention to the way that psychological similarities and differences influence the classification of neural state types -- and vice versa -- in actual scientific practice reveals that genuine multiple realization may be rarer than it initially seems (although they acknowledge that it sometimes occurs).

In Part II Polger and Shapiro also argue that various more recent attempts to give examples of multiple realization (e.g. the existence of neural plasticity) do not stand up to scrutiny. For example (pp. 93-5), it initially may seem as if "rewired ferrets" whose retinal stimulations are directed to portions of their auditory cortex have visual acuity similar to normal ferrets and thereby can (p. 93) 'see with their auditory cortex'.  But further investigation shows that the rewired ferrets perform worse than normal ferrets in various discrimination tasks. Moreover, Polger and Shapiro report that the degree to which the visual acuity of the rewired ferrets matches the visual acuity of the normals mirrors the degree to which the cells in their auditory cortex have been able to rearrange themselves to mimic the structure of cells in the visual cortex -- and so the realizers of the states that do perform the same functions are not so different after all.

On the other hand, they acknowledge that there are cases in which it would be difficult to argue that all the physical realizers of a mental state can be regarded as instances of the same type of neural state, e.g. memory, which seems to occur in a variety of creatures, from sea slugs and mice to humans, that are physically very diverse. But in this case, they argue (pp. 100-4), there are good empirical grounds to regard memory not as a second-order psychologically robust mental state or process, but rather as an overarching category that comprises a number of distinct (though related) mental states possessed by certain subsets of these physically disparate creatures. That is, the physical differences among these creatures mirror (second-order) psychological differences, rather than differences in the realizations of a common, more abstract, mental state. They acknowledge that (what they call) this "kind-splitting" response may prompt skepticism, since it may seem to sacrifice explanatory generality to save the type-identity Theory -- just as it did when earlier type-identity theorists such as Jaegwon Kim and David Lewis suggested that if the common sense theory of pain picks out different types of physical states in different creatures, then there would be human pain, octopus pain, and Martian pain. Once again, however, Polger and Shapiro point to current scientific practice to argue that there are empirically recognized, explanatorily robust, psychological differences among (at least some of) these processes that have physically disparate realizations.

Next, Polger and Shapiro consider whether there is reason to think that psychology would forfeit its explanatory generality if it were to embrace the type-identity theory (as Fodor and others suggest in their early challenges to the theory). Here they focus primarily on two questions: whether certain phenomena we've observed so far (such as convergent evolution or neuroplasticity) raise the likelihood of the multiple realizability of mental states, and whether the fruitfulness of abstract computational theories of mental states (such as David Marr's theory of early vision) renders the type-identity theory hopelessly parochial.

With regard to the first question, Polger and Shapiro contend that, as a matter of empirical fact, the neural states that realize the same genuinely psychological states in different species (rather than mere dispositions to behavior) have more physical similarities than it may initially seem -- and also that the laws that govern the effects of these states on behavior establish significant constraints on how much physical variation there can be among states that obey these laws, especially when the states are complex. With regard to the second, they argue that even if a computational theory is, as Fodor puts it, the "only game in town" -- which they dispute -- many computational theories are in fact "mixed" views that appeal to interactions among more concrete, medium-specific, neural states and processes. Such theories, as they put it (p. 161), "abstractly describe concrete causal processes that occur in brains", and therefore are compatible with a (liberalized) type-identity theory.

Finally, in Part III, Polger and Shapiro address (briefly) the related charges that acceptance of the type-identity theory commits one to eliminativism about mental states or, at the very least, undermines the autonomy of psychology. In response, they make the familiar point that since on their view mental states are real and have causal powers, they can be regarded as reduced to neural states rather than eliminated, and go on to argue that reduction is compatible with the autonomy of psychology as long as (p. 203) the existence of a genuine psychological explanation of some phenomenon does not rule out the possibility that there can be other explanations of that phenomenon. They appeal specifically to James Woodward's "interventionist" account of causal explanation, but argue more generally that there can be more than one scientifically legitimate explanation of a single phenomenon as long as there are counterfactuals expressible in those different scientific vocabularies that hold of that phenomenon.

To be sure, they acknowledge that on this view psychology need not be indispensible for explaining the phenomena in question, but they (fairly, I think) ask whether explanatory autonomy should require anything more. Moreover, they flesh out this response by suggesting, albeit briefly, that this sort of autonomy would seem sufficiently robust if we were to recognize that the relation between higher and lower level sciences is far from the (p. 217) 'neatly ordered hierarchy of scientific disciplines that Oppenheimer and Putnam once imagined' but instead consists of "layers" in which some entities reduce to entities on the next level down in the hierarchy, while some reduce to even lower-level entities -- and others do not reduce at all.

So, how well have Polger and Shapiro succeeded in their challenge to multiple realization? In my view, many of their criticisms of the "first wave" theorists on empirical grounds seem decisive, in particular, that examination of the ways in which working brain scientists individuate both psychological and neural states shows that critics of the identity theory tend to overestimate the functional similarities and underestimate the physical similarities among existing creatures that seem to have the same mental states -- and that this is due, at least in part, to an oversimplification of the relation between higher and lower level sciences. In addition, they present a good in principle defense of "kind splitting" -- in which scientists take robust physical differences among classes of individuals to be evidence of psychologically salient differences -- and they take us through a number of actual cases in which it seems reasonable to treat individual diversity in this way, rather than as evidence of multiple realization.

Moreover, I find their "Official Recipe" for multiple realization to be plausible, as well as their contention that other ways of characterizing multiple realization (e.g. by Kenneth Aizawa and Carl Gillett) make multiple realization too easy to achieve.

On the other hand, I worry that on their view, it is psychological-neural identity that may come too easily. For example, in their discussion of rewired ferrets, they argue that the match between the structure of the cells in the rewired ferrets' auditory cortex and the normal ferrets' visual cortex is sufficient for regarding those analogous states to be of the same lower-level type. But are structural similarities enough for lower-level commonalities? And if so, are those commonalities best regarded as physical, or rather psychofunctional -- and if they are psychofunctional, should these count as cases of identity or multiple realization?

A more radical example arises from Polger and Shapiro's response to speculations about the conceptual possibility of "machine minds" (pp. 146-9). They argue (p. 148) that it begs the question to assume that if there were machines or aliens psychologically similar to ourselves, then these creatures would have mental 'processing units that . . . differ relevantly from the brains of human beings'. However, if silicon-based creatures and machines that use electronic circuitry can count as having systems "relevantly" like ours, then the criteria for being "relevantly similar" are liberal indeed -- so liberal as to suggest that these may be cases of multiple realization rather than type-identity, even when the neural states are typed by very abstract physical properties.

In short, Polger and Shapiro's Official Recipe for multiple realization has much to recommend it, but in at least some cases, it may not be so straightforward to apply -- and doing so may require appeal not solely to empirical data and the practices of working brain scientists, but also to "philosophical" considerations (such as the difference between physical and topic-neutral properties, or between identity and constitution, or between causal and explanatory relevance). On the other hand, Polger and Shapiro often note that they are not saying that there are no cases in which psychological states are multiply realized, but merely that, as they put it on p. 35, 'the best overall model of psychological and neuroscientific processes makes substantial and important uses of identities.' So perhaps they would be happy to take identity where it can uncontroversially be found -- and they have indeed presented convincing arguments that there are many cases in which it is plausible to think that there is genuine type-identity between psychological and neural states. But for those not so sanguine, it would be good to see more discussion of these questions.

In any case, this book nicely brings together work that has had substantial impact on the way philosophers view the relative merits of functionalism and type-identity theory -- and should be of interest to philosophers, psychologists, and neuroscientists, both beginning and advanced. And if it raises questions that generate a "third wave" of debate and inquiry, then this is progress indeed.