The Musical Representation: Meaning, Ontology, and Emotion

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Charles O. Nussbaum, The Musical Representation: Meaning, Ontology, and Emotion, MIT Press, 2007, 388pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262140966.

Reviewed by Jenefer Robinson, University of Cincinnati


Music is in many ways the most puzzling of the arts. (1) There is the puzzle of musical meaning. If we think of paradigms of great instrumental music such as the symphonies of Beethoven or Brahms, they appear to have no meanings in the way that language does, yet they strike most listeners as profoundly meaningful. It also seems to make sense to say that one has understood or failed to understand, say, the final movement of Brahms' 4th, so it seems that there is something in this movement that deserves to be understood. (2) There is the puzzle of musical metaphor. There is an ongoing debate about whether even the most basic properties of music literally belong to a musical piece or can only be described metaphorically. Music moves forward; it is goes up to a high note and down to a low note; it departs from the tonic and returns home to it. Yet music would seem to be nothing but a sequence of sounds. It doesn't literally move up and down, leave home or return. So why do we inevitably hear music as doing just that? (3) There is a puzzle about how music can arouse emotions. According to most emotion theorists, it is crucial to an emotion that it represents some intentional object: I am happy about the inauguration of Obama and angry about the war in Iraq. Emotions seem to involve appraisals of the world as good or as offensive or whatever. Yet it is also widely agreed that music cannot represent such objects of appraisal, so it would seem that music cannot arouse emotions, at least not in the usual way. But most music listeners claim that listening to great music is a profoundly emotionally moving experience. How can this be?

All three problems and many others about music are addressed and illuminated in Charles Nussbaum's extremely accomplished book. The answers he offers take him and us on a long ride through large parts of the philosophy of mind, philosophy of science (especially philosophy of evolutionary biology), the philosophy of language, psychology, anthropology and more. Although his topic is music -- or rather, as he is careful to emphasize, "Western tonal art music since 1650" (20) -- Nussbaum's book is fundamentally a book in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science. It focuses on the internal representations which, on Nussbaum's view, make best sense of the musical experience of a comprehending listener. These internal representations provide the key to the musical experience and Nussbaum's answers to the three questions of musical meaning, musical metaphor and musical emotion that I just sketched.

(1) Music has meaning because it is representational, and it is representational in three ways. First, the musical surface is an "external representation:" it is a two-dimensional structure (of pitch and time) from which information can be derived. This information is accessed by means of an internal representation of the "hierarchical plan structure" of the piece. Nussbaum assumes that Lerdahl and Jackendoff's tree structures illustrating grouping and prolongation rules give an accurate picture of how a piece should be represented internally. So far Nussbaum sounds like a formalist. But he goes on to note that Lerdahl and Jackendoff's trees are organized in the same way as "motor control hierarchies" and "task level action plans" and that musical organization suggests "movements in virtual space" (82).

The internal representations employed in recovering the musical structure from the musical surface specify motor hierarchies and action plans, which in turn put the listener's body into off-line motor states that specify virtual movements through a virtual terrain or a scenario possessing certain features. (47)

On the basis of the "action plan" of a particular piece of music, listeners construct a third type of representation, a musical mental model that represents "the features of the layouts and scenarios in which these virtual movements occur" (82). Music is "an informationally structured set of tones" with virtual "affordances:" this passage is for virtual running, this for virtual pausing to reflect, this for leading, this for following.

Listening to music with understanding is imagining moving on a route through the virtual space and time of the music.

Nussbaum argues that a musical performance is a Millikanesque "pushmi-pullyu" representation: it both indicates the musical plan, "the hierarchical representations whose content is the organized musical surface" (99), and at the same time it prescribes the listener to 'implement' the plan by making it her own: "certain bodily sets must be adopted, and motor areas of the brain activated" (99). In other words, "the listener must act the music out" by playing or singing it as well as "[moving] through its virtual touch space in imagination and [simulating] the virtual entities contained in this space" (99). Nussbaum is himself a former professional musician and knows whereof he speaks, but anyone who has watched a flamboyant violin soloist or conductor can attest to the importance of bodily gestures to the performer or conductor interpreting the plan of the music.

(2) Nussbaum claims that the possibility of music's carrying what to most people would be 'extra-musical' meanings rests on the possibility of listeners' constructing musical mental models "that share structural attributes with models that are not musical" (italics in original). Borrowing from semantic field theory, he argues that the musical surface contains "field structure," for example, cyclical relations, kinship relations, and relations of affinity and contrast. According to Nussbaum, Lerdahl and Jackendoff tree structures model semantic field structures, so that, for example, one melody is a repeat of another in a different key, one phrase is subordinate to another in a longer phrase, one key has affinities for another, one melody contrasts with another, and so forth.

But the mental models constructed by the comprehending listener as she listens to a piece of music don't just map semantic field structures. They also model "scenarios, objects, and events in virtual musical space" (123) that can in turn model so-called "extra-musical content" (126). For example, a string quartet might exemplify a friendly conversation among four people. In Nussbaum's terms the musical "conversation" is a "scenario" in virtual musical space that "models conversational structure while emptying it of all propositional content" (125). Such a scenario is not merely heard, however; it is also enacted. A musical conversation is a "scenario" that "incorporates bodily sets and sequenced behaviors" (125) of the four "participants." Nussbaum makes the striking claim against the formalist that "all Western tonal art music since 1650, including so-called pure music, is program music," in the sense that it has "extramusical significance because the contents of the mental models it motivates are layouts and scenarios in which the listener acts off-line" (126).

Drawing on Lakoff and Johnson's theory of metaphor according to which abstract concepts are "metaphorically grounded" in "concepts of human kinesthetic and motor experience" (126), such as up/down, in/out, and so on, Nussbaum argues that when we say that music goes up and down, leaves home and returns, we are pointing to the way we enact the music's "action plan" in imagination as we listen. Moreover, "if the musical plan generates appropriate mental models and puts the listener's body into appropriate motor states off-line" (140), the musical mental models can then model abstract conceptual content, including even metaphysical conceptual content, although the modeling itself is necessarily gestural and non-conceptual. Hence music can function as a metaphor for even transcendental themes. In the final chapter Nussbaum explores some of the religious implications of our musical experience.

We seem to have come a long way from Lerdahl and Jackendoff. It seems to me unlikely that their tree diagrams, which parse the musical structure, can serve as the sole basis for the construction of mental models that enjoin the simulation of action plans in virtual space. The mental models that listeners construct as they listen are surely also due to more local aspects of the music, including dynamics and timbre.

(3) Finally, Nussbaum undertakes to explain not only how music can arouse emotions and emotional feelings, but also how the arousal of emotion is relevant to the emotional expressiveness of music. His account of emotion is indebted to the psychologist, Nico Frijda, who conceives of emotion 'from the inside' as "a valent perception or perceptual taking of a situation" as "relevant, urgent, and meaningful with respect to ways of dealing with it" (192), and 'from the outside' as "a bodily action tendency or change in action readiness that is generally … accompanied by arousal" (192). In Nussbaum's formulation: "An emotion … is a valent perception of an object, situation, or event relating to a core relational theme and accompanied by one or more modes of arousal as well as a change in action readiness" (199). In short, emotions are perceptions of Gibsonian affordances: the world as perceived demands an action plan. A perceived threat is for withdrawing or avoiding (in fear) or for approaching and confronting (in anger). Either way my body is in an aroused state, and my "emotional feelings" are the feelings of my bodily state, the autonomic arousal, the cowering or aggressive posture, the tense or flaccid muscle tone and so on. Unlike Jesse Prinz, who thinks that "an antecedent nonvalent perception" causes a bodily change which then "gives rise to an emotion" (193), for Nussbaum the emotion itself is a perception of the environment as emotionally charged.

Can music arouse emotions? Nussbaum argues that music sometimes arouses emotions in a straightforward way, such as the surprise evoked by Haydn's Surprise Symphony. More importantly, he thinks that "any and every successful performance" (209) can and should be experienced by the listener as an intimate "loving touch," that engenders the emotion of joy, not just pleasurable sensations, independently of whatever emotion or feeling (if any) is expressed by the piece.

Normally, however, the emotions apparently aroused by music do not have the music itself as their object. These are the cases that puzzle philosophers: how can music make me sad or nostalgic when there is nothing in particular for me to be sad or nostalgic about? Nussbaum agrees that there is not usually any "material object" of musical emotions, and there may not be an "intentional object" either, in which case music is arousing mere "emotional feelings" rather than emotions proper. However, Nussbaum has argued that when listening to music we construct mental models that attempt to model the "virtual musical terrain" (214) traversed by the music. As we negotiate this terrain, emotional feelings arise as we act in accordance with the "musical affordances, dealing with surprises, impediments, failures, and successes on the way" (214). Moreover, since all music is program music, a musical scenario may contain "musical virtual objects" (201) that are tracked by the listener in egocentric musical space. In such cases the emotions and emotional feelings we experience are analogous to the simulated "off-line" emotional reactions that we experience for characters and plot developments in a novel. Music of course does not have a syntax and semantics in the same way that language does and does not denote like predicates do. The content of music is nonconceptual: musical mental models are nonconceptual analogue representations of virtual layouts and scenarios in a virtual musical space in which the listener in imagination acts.

This account of musical experience allows Nussbaum to advance a genuinely original theory of emotional expression in music. Nussbaum argues that a musical episode is "a representation with nonconceptual content, a pushmi-pullyu representation mandating construction of a model of a virtual feature domain" (237) through which the listener can move by negotiating virtual obstacles, etc. The listener in imagination implements the action plan of the music and this puts him into actual bodily states. These bodily states are typically inhibited, since the corresponding actions are merely simulated, but if they weren't they would be the bodily states that signal a certain state of mind: sad, belligerent, nostalgic, mischievous, or whatever. In other words, the expressive character of a musical episode is founded on the responses induced by enacting the musical action plan. Kendall Walton has argued that in listening to expressive music we imagine of the auditory sensations we experience that they are experiences of our very own sadness or mischievousness or whatever. Nussbaum's theory explains how this can be so.

In this brief summary I have focused on only a few of the many themes in this rich and rewarding book. I have also ignored a whole chapter on the ontology of music.

How plausible is the theory as a whole? Nussbaum seems to be committed to a variety of theories on different topics, many of which are themselves questionable: field theory in semantics, the Lakoff and Johnson "body in the mind" theory of metaphor, the Jeannerod account of motor plans, the theory of non-conceptual content, and much else. I find myself skeptical about some of the details, for example, the emphasis on "musical touch," the existence of which I would think is impossible to confirm or refute. I also find it hard to assess the argument of the final chapter, in which Nussbaum defends a naturalized version of the claim that music can free us temporarily from "the nauseating press of contingent existence" (295). There he explores the implications of the fact, as he sees it, that the nonconceptual nature of the mental models the listener constructs tends "to dissolve epistemic and metaphysical barriers between subject and subject and between subject and object," a result that not only "encourages simulation of virtual musical objects and further enhances emotional involvement with the musical scenario content" (257) but also links music to religious experience.

Nevertheless, however skeptical one might be about the details, this is a fine book that brings together a rich array of intellectual resources to the question of how listeners understand and respond appropriately to music. For philosophers of music it may not be an easy book but it is one that needs to be read. It illuminates a whole range of issues in philosophy of music and offers compelling solutions to an array of long-standing problems about the nature of musical experience and the relationships between music and emotion. But readers of this journal should note that it deserves to be studied not only by philosophers of music but by all those in philosophy of mind and cognitive science who are interested in the many and varied ways in which the human mind/brain represents the world.