The Myth of an Afterlife: The Case against Life after Death

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Michael Martin and Keith Augustine (eds.), The Myth of an Afterlife: The Case against Life after Death, Rowman and Littlefield, 2015, xxxi + 675pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780810886773.

Reviewed by William Hasker, Huntington University


It is tempting to describe Michael Martin and Keith Augustine's book as an anti-survivalist tract, but "tract" may be the wrong word for a 700-page volume with 30 different contributors. Perhaps better, it is a sustained polemic on the contention expressed in the title. (We are told there are no pro-afterlife contributors because the majority of published writing on the subject is by believers in an afterlife; thus the need to redress the balance.) The first item, before the preface and the editors' introduction, is "On the Origin of Afterlife Beliefs by Means of Memetic Selection," by Steve Stewart-Williams. Belief in an afterlife, we learn, is a "selfish meme"; it is comparable to cigarette smoking in that the belief gives little satisfaction but giving it up tends to involve considerable pain. Nothing sur­prising in this, but one might wonder about the piece's placement; it could well have been included in the concluding section, "Dubious Evidence for Survival." It is hard to avoid the impression that the purpose was to nip in the bud any tendency on the reader's part to suppose that there might be epistemically respectable reasons for belief in an afterlife.

Part I is devoted to "Empirical Arguments for Annihilation." Here we are given a considerable variety of evidence showing in detail how various kinds of mental activity are dependent on brain functions. Matt McCormick leads off with "Dead as a Doornail: Souls, Brains, and Survival." Jean Mercer compares soul theory with behavior genetics as a means for explaining personality. David Weisman argues that the symptoms of the dying brain point to annihilation. Rocco J. Gennaro and Yonatan I. Fishman advocate that the argument from brain damage shows that the end of the brain means the end of a person's existence. Gualtiero Piccinini and Sonya Bahar argue from the neural localization of mental functions that there can be no mental life after the brain has died. Carlos J. Álvarez argues that emotions are the product of the brain and cannot exist without it. Terence Hines points to the specialization of the brain for processing language; again, once the brain dies there can be no more linguistic capabilities. Jamie Horder, in "The Brain that Doesn't Know Itself," points to instances of person with neurological defects who are oblivious to their deficiencies.

Non-specialists will find new and interesting details here, but the overall picture will be familiar to those who have followed the progress of the brain sciences. It is crystal clear that, in normal human life, mental function is dependent in an intimate and fine-grained way on brain function. The question is what this implies for the existence or non-existence of a soul. The most extensive case for a negative verdict on the soul is made in the section's final piece, "The Dualist's Dilemma: The High Cost of Reconciling Neuroscience with a Soul," by Augustine and Yonatan I. Fishman. Their ostensible purpose is to apply principles of scientific reasoning, featuring "Mill's methods and modern epidemiological principles," to the choice between the dependence thesis, that "having a functioning brain is anecessary condition for having conscious experiences," and its denial, the independence thesis (203). However, they go well beyond the dependence thesis, arguing that brain function is not merely a necessary condition but in fact is a sufficient cause for experience, thus rendering an immaterial soul otiose. They also devote some attention to alleged evidence for the activity of unembodied consciousness, in the form of paranormal phenomena of various kinds.

In making their case against the soul on the basis of the neurological evidence, the authors cite several times my The Emergent Self.[1] A typical example: "As Hasker succinctly puts it, 'the actual dependence of mind and personality on brain goes far beyond what one would naturally expect on the basis of Cartesian dualism'" (245). In exploiting this statement, however, they ignore the final qualifying phase. Cartesian dualists do, I believe, have a problem in this regard, but this may not be true of some other versions of dualism. Arguably it is not true for Thomistic dualism, in which the soul is the "form of the body." (The typical Thomistic claim that rational thought has no bodily organ must however be given up.) And it is not true for emergent dualism, in which a substantial soul emerges from the func­tioning of the brain and nervous system. There may be other objections to these and other varieties of non-Cartesian dualism, but they are not as vulnerable to the neurological evidence as Augustine and Fishman suppose.

They do devote some attention to possible falsification of the dependence thesis, chiefly by experiments involving alleged out-of-body or near-death experiences, in which information is supposedly obtained in ways that defy normal scientific explanation. They argue that such positive results as have been obtained are flawed, because the experiments are inade­quately controlled, or because they cannot be replicated, or for other comparable reasons. I am not certain that the standards being applied here are entirely appropriate. If we were examining the claim that paranormal evidence provides conclusive scientific proof of a non-physical mind, the approach taken by Augustine and Fishman might be the right one. But they are aiming higher than this. They are not satisfied with a verdict of "not proven"; their aim is to discredit entirely any and all evidence for an immaterial mind. (As they admit, even a single instance of an actual paranormal event would falsify their hypothesis.) Given this objec­tive, it is questionable whether they can afford to dismiss as irrelevant studies that fall short of perfection; not to speak of anecdotal evidence, which they do not even consider. (Those who believe in an afterlife because of the resurrection of Jesus evidently will not be convinced by this approach.) In medical research less than perfect studies are not typically rejected out of hand; rather they are carefully evaluated for their possible significance. And physicians treating individual patients typically operate with much less than ideal information without thereby being any less rational.

Part II is devoted to "Conceptual and Empirical Difficulties for Survival." Here we get a rehearsal of mostly familiar arguments opposing dualism and survival. Raymond D. Bradley argues for emergent materialism. After rehearsing some anti-dualist arguments he states, "Those who adopt the metaphysical hypothesis of substance dualism get their thinking tied up in knots when we ask the simplest and most obvious questions about how their ideas are to be cashed out" (321). No doubt Richard Swinburne would be interested to learn this about himself! Theodore M. Drange writes on conceptual problems for a disembodied afterlife, and also on the "pluralizability objection" to a new-body afterlife -- that is, the problem that it would be possible for a person to be multiply resurrected. The latter is a well-known problem for materialist theories of the resurrection, but Drange argues that even if there were nonphysical souls, that wouldn't help: "If souls are, by definition, nonphysical, then they cannot be identifying or individuating principles" (406). David L. Wilson argues that nonphysical souls would violate physical laws; Leonard Angel asserts that since physical formulas are not violated, no soul controls the body; and David Papineau concludes that there is no trace of any soul linked to the body. (A bit more later on these.) Jaegwon Kim asks his now-familiar question, "What Could Pair a Nonphysical Soul to a Physical Body?" (This is really an anti-Cartesian argument; it applies only if nonphysical souls are also assumed to be nonspatial.) Susan Blackmore argues for "The Implausibility of Astral Bodies and Astral Worlds," and Eric T. Olson sums up with "Life After Death and the Devastation of the Grave." The arguments in this section are not trivial, but neither are they unanswerable. Little would be served by rehearsing the arguments and the answers here, even if that were possible.

Part III, "Problematic Models of the Afterlife," contains three essays. Ingrid Hansen Smythe criticizes the theory of karma and rebirth, largely but not exclusively on ethical grounds. This theory is really the ultimate version of "blaming the victim"; whatever harms befall one are deserved because of bad karma accumulated either in this or a previous life. (Even today, Buddhist women with unfaithful or abusive husbands are told that this is because of their own bad karma.) Raymond D. Bradley argues that a good God could not condemn anyone to hell. And Martin argues that there are problems with heaven -- specifically, that "the notion of human existence in Heaven -- be it disembodied or embodied -- is conceptually unintelligible," and "it remains a mystery how the denizens of Heaven can have free will and yet presumably do little that is morally wrong" (433).

Part IV is "Dubious Evidence for Survival." Rense Lange and James Houran consider experiences of ghosts and poltergeists; they state, "we regard hauntings and poltergeists as mistaken perceptions arising from an interaction among paranormal beliefs, paranormal experiences, and fear of the paranormal" (508). Susan Blackmore argues against out-of-body experiences as evidence for survival. Augustine contends that near-death experiences are hallucinatory. Champe Ransom offers a list of criticisms of research by Ian Stevenson that claims to provide evidence of rebirth. Next is an article in which Angel gives further criticisms of Stevenson's work. Claus Flodin Larsen provides an amusing account of the subterfuges used by mediums to establish their claims and of the poor quality research that is sometimes called upon to vindicate those claims. Christian Battista, Nicolas Gauvrit, and Etienne LeBel provide a detailed critique of "triple-blind" mediumship experiments conducted by Julie Beischel and Gary Schwartz. The book concludes with David Lester's "Is There Life After Death? A Review of the Supporting Evidence." This essay consists, as one might expect, of skeptical reflections about various types of evidence coupled with a critique of research that has been done scrutinizing this evidence. A general observation concerning the essays in this section is that, even where the critiques are successful, they create a serious problem only for those who accord significant weight to the particular class of evidence under consideration. In each case there are some such persons, but they do not constitute a majority or even a large fraction of those who believe in life after death.

Interestingly, the book comparatively neglects what might be termed worldview considerations. There is some discussion of the mind-body problem, but much of it could be termed cursory. The authors feel little need to engage seriously with sophisticated contemporary dualists, and they hardly pay attention to criticisms and objections to materialism featured, for example, in Koons and Bealer's The Waning of Materialism.[2] (Such arguments are also found in The Emergent Self; that is worth mentioning here because Augustine, at least, seems familiar with the book.) Admittedly, the view that mind-body dualism deserves no serious consideration is common in contemporary philosophy. But this attitude is particularly unfortunate in the present context: many, probably most, believers in an afterlife are mind-body dualists, and the failure to engage seriously with this viewpoint must be accounted a weakness of the book.[3] Perhaps even more striking is the omission of any consideration of theism as a serious option. This omission is impor­tant because theism and belief in an afterlife provide important support for each other. Theism needs an afterlife in which injustices can be remedied and suffering assuaged; without this, there is a massive, perhaps insoluble, problem of evil. And on the other hand belief in an afterlife is far more plausible if theism is accepted. This is not merely because God is needed, on many views, in order to secure personal survival. Beyond this, there is need of something like divine agency to insure that conditions in an afterlife are morally benign. This applies even to the belief in reincarna­tion, in spite of the fact that reincarnation is affirmed by some non-theistic religions. Some morally perceptive agency is required to see to it that the conditions of a being's rebirth correspond with its karmic status, something that can hardly be left to the impersonal laws of nature to bring about.[4] If atheism is the default assumption, as it appears to be in these essays, that seriously biases the overall case that is being made.

This review has not examined in detail the various arguments presented; this is precluded by space limitations and by the extent and variety of the material. There is however one argument for which an exception needs to be made. The argument is especially prominent in the essays by Wilson, Angel, and Papineau in Part II, but it is present implicitly or explicitly in many other places. It may be stated as follows:

1.     Nothing that goes on in the brain violates the predictions of physical science.

2.     If there were an immaterial soul affecting the brain this would lead to a violation of physical formulas. Therefore,

3.     There is no non-physical soul that might survive bodily death.

Premise (1) is a consequence of the causal closure of the physical domain: any physical event that has a cause has a physical cause. Or as Angel puts it, "no natural change violates a prediction (or outcome) in physical formulas" (378). Granted this, the rest of the argument is plausible. If this argu­ment is conceded, it gives anti-survivalists most of what they want in a single stroke. To be sure, there are some materialist views of the resurrection that may be consistent with the soundness of (1)-(3). These views would not, however, qualify as among the more plausible and attrac­tive versions of belief in an afterlife. This argument, then, needs to be addressed.

The first point to be made is that, in spite of frequent assertions to the contrary, premise (1) is not known to be true. What is in question is whether an immaterial mind may be exerting a causal influence on what happens in the brain at a micro-level. Influence on this scale is far below the limits of our present capacity to detect. Furthermore, we have only the vaguest notion of what it is we would be trying to detect because we know little about how the brain actually works at this level. I am tempted to say that we don't know the "machine code" for the brain, but this understates the case. We don't even know how the basic hard­ware (rather, wetware) functions with regard to giving rise to particular kinds of conscious experience. We don't know, in spite of many proposals, the neural correlate of consciousness, the minimum neural functioning that is required for any kind of conscious experience to occur. We are roughly in the position of a member of a primitive society who, confronted with a transistor radio, reasons that since there is no human being speaking in the vicinity, the radio must be speaking to him on its own. He simply lacks the equipment that would be required to detect the electromagnetic waves that are carrying the signal to the radio, as well as the knowledge to appreciate their significance. Under these circumstances, the claim that we have experimental verification of premise (1) can't be made out. One might, to be sure, affirm (1) as a plausible extrapolation from the scientific knowledge we do have, in the light of one's own overall (probably naturalistic) worldview. Understood in this way, however, the argument no longer has any compelling force against mind-body dualism. Furthermore there is an important objection to (1) even taken in this non-dogmatic way.

This leads to the second point: there is strong reason to think that premise (1) is false. Here's the argument. We humans are able to engage in conscious rational thought, resulting in a reasonably accurate apprehension of the world in which we live. This can be taken as a datum; clearly, anti-survivalists cannot afford to challenge it, relying as they do on scientific knowledge of many different kinds. This datum, however, is a fact which requires explana­tion. There is, furthermore, one particular sort of explanation which will be accepted by most readers of this review, probably including all anti-survivalists. That expla­nation is found in evolutionary epistemology. The basic idea is familiar: the sorts of mental functioning which lead to a generally accurate apprehension of the world lead thereby to behavior which is conducive to survival and reproduction, and so those sorts of mental functioning tend to prevail over others in the course of evolution. This may or may not be the complete explanation for human rational capabilities (I doubt that it is), but it does seem to be an important part of the explanation.

Now, here is the crucial point: If premise (1) is true, that is, if causal closure obtains, then evolutionary epistemology cannot be the explanation for human rationality. The reasoning is simple and compelling. If causal closure is true, then everything that happens in the brain has its complete explanation in prior physical events, no doubt mainly earlier brain-events. But this means that prior mental events play no role in determining the state of a person's brain -- and therefore, they play no role in the organism's behavior. It follows, furthermore, that mental events and processes are irrelevant to behavior and are thus invisible to natural selection, which can only operate on physical structures and physical behavior. So natural selection cannot select for superior mental processes, nor can it play any role in explaining the effectiveness of the mental processes we actually employ in getting to know the world. This enormously important fact -- that we are able to reason about the world and gain know­ledge of it -- is left completely unexplained. I predict, furthermore, that within the generally naturalistic framework that is presupposed in this discussion, it will not be possible to find a promising alternative explanation.

It is sometimes thought that this problem can be surmounted by adopting mind-body identity theory. If the physical brain-event is also a mental event, then the mental event is after all causally relevant to behavior, and natural selection can operate to select superior mental processes. This however is a mistake. We have, it is proposed, a single event, which has both physical characteristics and mental characteristics. Notice, however, that only the physical characteristics of the event are causally effective. The causal consequences of that event will be those, and only those, that flow from it as determined by physical forces, as recognized by the true laws of physics. The mental characteristics of the event, whatever they may be, have no effect whatever in determining the subsequent behavior. Once again, natural selection is unable either to select for superior mental function or to explain the efficacy of the mental processes we actually employ. We are left completely without any explanation for the fact, if it is a fact, that mental events that lead to evolutionarily successful outcomes generally coincide with those that involve an accurate representation of the world. The general effect­iveness of our reasoning processes is still entirely unexplained. I submit that any view of the mind and the self that has this consequence is at a severe disadvantage. The price for accepting premise (1) of the argument is extremely high.

Some of my comments have been critical, but Martin and Augustine deserve credit for assembling this wide-ranging group of papers in opposition to belief in an afterlife. For those who agree with them, the collection offers a virtual armory of ready-made weapons. For others, it comprises an impressive assemblage of obstacles that must be overcome or circumvented. This conversation gives no signs of ending in the foreseeable future.

[1] William Hasker, The Emergent Self (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).

[2] Robert C. Koons and George Bealer, eds., The Waning of Materialism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010).

[3] This comment applies specifically to the selections included in the book; it may not be true of all of the contributors in their other writings. Kim, in particular, has devoted considerable attention to the difficulties of various forms of materialism.

[4] For a bit more on this argument, see Charles Taliaferro and William Hasker, "Afterlife," in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, revised August 2014.