The Myth of Morality

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Joyce, Richard, The Myth of Morality, Cambridge, 2002, 264pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521808065.

Reviewed by R. Jay Wallace, University of California, Berkeley


This book is an impressive and stimulating treatment of central issues in metaethics. It is extremely well-written, combining clarity and precision with an individual style that is engaging and very often witty. It presents a general commentary on the contemporary metaethical debate, on the way to defending a position in that debate—moral fictionalism—that is distinctive and worthy of reaching a wider audience. The book is full of arguments, presenting a wealth of stimulating ideas, objections, and suggestions on all the topics addressed.

A significant virtue of the book is Joyce’s success at clarifying the menu of fundamental options in the metaethical discussion. He does an excellent job throughout of defining the issues under dispute, stating precisely the differences between the available positions, and locating the most significant considerations for and against those positions. The book could easily serve as a clear introduction to the main issues in the contemporary metaethical debate for those who are new to the subject.

Joyce’s favored position combines two main parts. There is, first, an error theory of moral discourse, to the effect that such discourse is typically used in an assertoric manner, but that moral assertions by and large fail to state truths (9). And there is, second, the distinctively fictionalist claim that it may be sensible and useful to continue to deploy moral discourse even after we have come to see that it is fundamentally flawed.

The bulk of the book is given over to the defense of the error theory. By Joyce’s own account, this involves identifying a central or ’non-negotiable’ commitment of moral discourse that is nevertheless false. Joyce takes as his starting point in this endeavor J. L. Mackie’s suggestion that it is the objective prescriptivity of moral assertions that is most problematic about them. What exactly might be meant by talk of objective prescriptivity in this connection? In chap. 1 Joyce considers the ’internalist’ idea that judgments of moral obligation are necessarily motivating. He contends that internalism in this form is implausible, but he does not think that it can be shown decisively to be a non-negotiable commitment of moral discourse. A better candidate for such a commitment results when we interpret objective prescriptivity as a claim about reasons for action, in particular as the claim that moral obligations provide agents with inescapable reasons for complying with them—reasons that obtain regardless of the agent’s desires and interests. Chap. 2 defends the thesis that the aspiration to provide categorical reasons of this kind is a non-negotiable commitment of ordinary moral discourse, something without which we would not understand a person’s assertions as moral claims. Chaps. 3-5 proceed to argue that this central commitment of moral assertion is false, defending a non-Humean version of the instrumentalist claim that all normative reasons for action depend on the agent’s interests and desires. If this claim in the theory of practical reason is true, of course, then there are no categorical reasons of the kind morality affects to provide, and the non-negotiable commitment of morality to provide agents with such reasons is false.

The discussion in these chapters forms the crux of the negative part of Joyce’s discussion, defending the conclusion that moral discourse is flawed (in a way analogous to the way in which we take Polynesian discourse about the ’tapu’ to be systematically flawed). The argument for this conclusion is intricate, and it proceeds largely through critical engagement with the writings of other contemporary moral philosophers (above all Michael Smith, but also Bernard Williams, Christine Korsgaard, and others). The most successful and important aspect of this argument is the distinction Joyce draws between subjective and objective dimensions of practical reason. He contends, plausibly in my view, that it is not necessarily irrational for agents to fail to do what they have reason to do; if I reasonably believe that the glass before me contains a gin and tonic, when in fact it is full of gasoline, then it is not irrational for me to try to drink the liquid in the glass, though objectively speaking there is a compelling reason for me not to do so, and the reason I take to speak in favor of drinking the liquid does not really obtain. Questions of practical rationality are conditioned by the epistemic situation of an agent, and the mere fact that I would desire to do X if I had true beliefs (about my circumstances and the consequences of X-ing) does not make it rational for me to decide to do X. This is an important point, whose consequences for the theory of practical reason may be more significant than Joyce lets on (he mostly makes use of the distinction to counter certain claims of Smith’s). For instance, it enables a defender of external reasons for action—reasons that are not grounded in the agent’s subjective motivations—to ascribe reasons to agents that those agents are not willing to acknowledge, without being saddled with the often implausible further contention that such agents are guilty of irrationality. The abusive husband (to take one of Williams’ famous examples) may have reason to desist from his abusive behavior, but his failure to acknowledge that reason makes him cruel, insensitive, brutish, etc., not irrational.

These good points about the relations between reasons and rationality, however, are embedded in a baroque and unhelpful apparatus of further distinctions. Joyce multiplies reasons beyond necessity, referring at various points to institutional reasons, subjective reasons, objective reasons, normative reasons, irrational reasons, and Williams-style reasons. This is confusing, and detracts from clarity. To my mind, there is only one notion of a reason that is relevant to Joyce’s discussion. This is the notion of a normative reason, in the basic and familiar sense of a consideration that counts in favor of a given person’s doing something (say, X-ing). An ’objective’ reason is a genuine normative reason in this sense, a consideration that really does count in favor of the person’s X-ing. ’Subjective’ reasons are not really reasons at all, but rather beliefs of agents about what they have reason to do.1 ’Irrational’ reasons are beliefs of this kind that are unwarranted or irrational (given the rest of what the agent believes and is in a position to find out). Institutional considerations are sometimes and for some agents genuine normative reasons for action. But when this condition is not satisfied, they do not become reasons of some further kind (i.e. institutional as opposed to normative reasons); rather there are institutional rules or regulations that wrongly present themselves are normative reasons. Finally, Williams’ influential writings about this issue do not introduce yet another kind of reason (the ’Williams-style’ reason), rather they offer an account or theoretical framework for understanding reasons in the basic sense of a normative consideration. The crucial issue for Joyce’s purposes, in these terms, is whether there are any categorical reasons in the basic normative sense, reasons that obtain regardless of the interests and desires of the agent. If not, then the central commitment of morality to provide reasons of this kind will be unfulfilled, justifying the claim that assertoric moral discourse systematically fails to state truths.

When they finally get to Joyce’s main argument against such reasons, however, readers may find themselves somewhat disappointed. Joyce agrees with Williams that normative reasons must be capable of moving the agent who has them to action, and he appeals to the familiar Humean theory of action-explanation in support of the idea that reasons can motivate only if they are appropriately grounded in the agent’s subjective desires and interests (109-11).2 But the role of desires in the explanation of action does not support this conclusion (as even Smith, the prime defender of the ’Humean theory of motivation’, would agree). At least since Nagel’s The Possibility of Altruism, it has been pretty clear that at least some of the pro-attitudes or intentions that are implicated in action are not themselves sources or conditions of the agent’s reasons, but rather responses to the recognition of reasons on the part of the agent. Furthermore, there are numerous models available in contemporary moral psychology that aim to render intelligible the capacity of such normative cognitions to generate new motivations in this way (e.g. through the postulation of higher-order dispositions that are partly constitutive of rationality, or by appeal to the capacities for self-determining choice that distinguish rational agents from other creatures capable only of more rudimentary agency). I do not of course mean to suggest that this issue has been decided conclusively one way or another; but given that this is the crux of Joyce’s positive case for his error theory, it would be reasonable to expect a deeper level of engagement with alternative ways of accounting for rational motivation in this part of the book.3

The argument about reasons is supplemented by a discussion of evolutionary ethics (chap. 6), which is exemplary in its clarity and good sense, and which brings a refreshingly new set of considerations to bear on the metaethical issues. Joyce argues that evolution can account for our tendency to deploy moral concepts, suggesting that a primitive tendency to think of actions as ’required’ might have been exploited by natural selection to encourage cooperation in human communities (secs. 6.0-6.1). This contributes to Joyce’s error theory, insofar as it renders intelligible the widespread tendency to use a form of discourse that is manifestly defective. But Joyce thinks that it also contributes positively to the case in favor of an error theory of morality, arguing that the evolutionary explanation he has offered shows that the process whereby we form moral beliefs is an unreliable one (162-3). The idea is that the evolutionary explanation entails that we are disposed to form moral beliefs regardless of the evidence to which we are exposed, and this independence of moral beliefs from the truth shows those beliefs to be unjustified (without, however, providing independent evidence that such beliefs are false: cf. 168).

I find this argument from evolution unpersuasive. The evolutionary account on offer operates through the general human capacity for belief formation, since the account attributes to agents a tendency to form the belief that cooperative behaviors are categorically required. But surely the general human capacity for belief formation is one that does not operate independently of the evidence for or against the beliefs that are held. If evolution is to exploit this mechanism by inducing a disposition to form moral beliefs with a certain content, it is plausible to suppose that it will be able to do this only if the disposition induced does not operate in a way that is independent of the truth. In other words, if we just consider the evolutionary evidence by itself, there seems no good reason to hypothesize that the disposition to form beliefs about categorical moral requirements operates in a way that is independent of the evidence—perhaps no such disposition would have emerged from evolution if the moral belief had been false. (Of course Joyce takes himself to have other grounds for holding that moral beliefs must be false; but at this point in the book we are supposed to be getting an independent argument for the error theory based on natural selection: cf. 148).

This brings me to the most interesting part of Joyce’s book, which is the fictionalist account of morality offered in chaps. 7-8. Joyce’s fictionalism maintains that we have good pragmatic reasons for continuing to deploy moral discourse despite the falsity of the claims that are made through its use. This fictionalist position may be thought of as having three parts. There is, first, a distinction between different contexts of reflection and discourse: critical contexts on the one hand, in which we acknowledge the error that is latent in moral discourse, and uncritical contexts of deliberation and action, in which defective moral discourse may continue to be deployed (sec. 7.4). Second, there is a noncognitivist account of what we might be doing in uncritical contexts when we use moral discourse that we know to be false (sec. 7.6). According to this noncognitivist account, uncritical moral language functions to express—not desires or emotions or pro-attitudes, as traditional noncognitivist theories hold—but rather thoughts about what is the case (by contrast with the beliefs that are expressed by ordinary assertoric language). Third, there is a pragmatic argument for the advantages of deploying moral discourse in this expressive way outside of critical contexts of reflection and inquiry. The argument here is that, by comparison with the alternative of abolishing altogether the use of moral discourse, it would be more beneficial to continue to use such discourse in the expressivist manner outside of contexts of critical reflection. Doing so promises to bring with it many of the undoubted advantages of moral beliefs when it comes to the kind of self-control that enables us to promote our own long-term interests, but without the costs that come with full-scale false beliefs (secs. 7.1, 8.0-8.1). Much as we might summon a grisly mental image of a blackened lung when we feel tempted to light up another cigarette, so too we might entertain the thought that lying is wrong when we feel tempted not to tell the truth, and in this way ensure that we retain the benefits that typically accrue from cooperation.

This is certainly not very plausible as an account of how we actually operate with ordinary moral discourse. But Joyce is not proposing fictionalism in that guise. He is an error theorist precisely because he takes it that we use moral language assertorically to make assertions that systematically fail to state truths. Fictionalism is offered as a revisionist response to the acknowledgement that moral discourse is defective in this way, one that is to be preferred on cost-benefit grounds to the abolitionist alternative of throwing morality out the window. Joyce’s presentation of this position is characteristically clear and sophisticated, and it is good to have his engaging defense of this neglected option in metaethical discussion. But I do not myself believe that fictionalism about morality has much of a future; let me mention in closing a few reasons for this conclusion.

First, Joyce’s way of distinguishing between critical and uncritical contexts of reflection seems to me problematic. The assumption is evidently that we do our critical thinking when we abstract from deliberative contexts, and engage in detached metaethical reflection about the status and commitments of our moral concepts; this is the philosophical context in which we arrive at the conclusion that moral discourse is defective. This distinctively philosophical context is supposedly more critical and reflective than the deliberative contexts in which we are deciding what to do in the face of various temptations, where we are encouraged to adopt an expressive use of moral language. But it seems dubious to me to assert that the philosophical context is necessarily the more critical one. Reflective deliberation about difficult practical problems is itself a highly critical context of enquiry, in which we marshal our beliefs about our deliberative situation, and scrutinize our values and commitments, with the aim of arriving at a well-grounded conclusion about what it would be best to do. This context of critical deliberation is to my mind the most authoritative venue for testing claims about our normative reasons for action. Moreover it is precisely the kind of context in which moral issues and values often loom large. But it is hard to see how a fictionalist deployment of moral discourse might hold up under conditions of critical deliberation such as these. Critical reflection, in short, is not something reserved for the philosopher’s study, rather it is a part of life, and to the extent this is the case it will be hard to find an appropriate context for the noncognitive mobilization of moral thoughts that are rejected under critical reflection.

Furthermore, even when we can distinguish between more and less critical contexts, it is not obvious to me that these contexts are as hermetically independent of each other as Joyce seems to suppose. (In this respect, his fictionalist theory shares a problematic assumption with ’two-level’ versions of consequentialism.) Joyce imagines that we can steel ourselves to act for the best in the face of temptation—where, I take it, the ’best’ action is the one that advances our own long-term interests and projects—by applying to our situation moral concepts in thoughts we entertain without really believing. But if the critical background is really one in which we reject moral claims as false, I do not believe that entertaining moral thoughts in ’uncritical’ deliberation could have the practical benefits Joyce envisages. Here it is helpful to contrast other familiar strategies of self-control. When I summon a mental image of the blackened lung to help me fight the temptation to light up a cigarette, I am not entertaining a cognition that I would reject under more critical conditions of inquiry. Rather I am forcing myself to focus on a consideration—namely, the risk of an early and unpleasant death—that I critically accept as a compelling reason not to smoke, but that I might be inclined to forget or downplay when faced with the immediate gratifications of a cigarette. There is here a conceptual consistency and continuity between the more critical contexts and those allegedly less critical circumstances that call for special methods of self-control, and the effectiveness of the methods used in such circumstances hinges on their being anchored in our more critical convictions. By contrast, it would hardly be a very effective strategy of self-control to entertain the thought that smoking is (say) against the law, if I believe upon reflection that this thought is false. Essentially the same objection applies to the fictionalist proposal that we should entertain moral thoughts that we know to be false in order to bring our behavior into alignment with our true interests.4 The strategy, it seems to me, simply wouldn’t work, and the reason is that the borders between the more and less critical contexts that Joyce distinguishes are permeable.

Finally, I believe that Joyce operates with too limited a battery of options when he runs his cost-benefit analysis of fictionalism. The main alternative to it that he considers is abolitionism, the complete rejection of moral discourse in all contexts as fundamentally flawed. The implicit assumption seems to be that, once we have accepted that there are no categorical reasons of the kind morality affects to provide, we must either reject morality out of hand, or treat it as a kind of elaborate pretense in special deliberative situations. But this seems to me an artificially monolithic way of thinking about morality. Even if we grant Joyce the idea that the commitment to provide categorical reasons is a ’non-negotiable’ part of morality as we understand it, it is not the only distinctive part of morality. A different option, one that Joyce does not consider, would be to reject the aspect of morality that turns out to be problematic upon critical scrutiny, while retaining as much of the rest as we continue to find useful and important. Thus morality is not just an abstract form of discourse, it also collects a set of concrete values that people find themselves committed to for various (sometimes contingent) reasons, values such as fairness, decency, consideration, respect, and solicitude. I do not myself accept the conclusion that values of these kinds do not ground reasons for action that are categorical or external. But if I did, I would want to try to retain a central place for these values in my life (and in the lives of people in my community), even while acknowledging openly that our conventional understanding of the reasons they provide must be rejected.

This is the path taken by Bernard Williams, for instance, who rejected the commitment to abstract categorical imperatives at the center of the ’Morality System’, while arguing that we could continue to live in the spirit of the concrete values distinctive of morality. Williams did not see himself simply as offering an interpretation of morality—with the rejection of the categorical moral ’must’, he thought, something important to morality really is lost—but he also did not think that the whole structure should be discarded once this point is accepted. This is an important respect in which moral discourse differs from discourse about phlogiston (cf. 2-7). Given the purpose of the latter discourse to offer an explanation of certain physical phenomena, there is really nothing left to salvage once we have come to see that these purposes are better served by theories that dispense with the concept of phlogiston. With morality, by contrast, the rejection of the claim to provide categorical reasons leaves us with a variety of values and ideas whose point and purpose is not exhausted in the aspiration to ground such categorical reasons. If you are moved by Joyce’s arguments for an error theory, it seems to me you should think about the non-categorical reasons we have to care about such values as decency, justice, and respect, and try to find a way to incorporate such values in your life while openly acknowledging that they are not all that they once seemed to be.5


1. Joyce would disagree with this typology—he suggests (100, 108) that normative reasons should be identified with an agent’s ’rational subjective reasons’ But this strikes me as misleading: if, unbeknownst to me, a tiger has escaped from the local zoo and is now lurking in my garden, then it seems I have a very good normative reason for staying indoors, insofar as there is a consideration that decisively speaks in favor of that course of action. Whether I am irrational in failing to act on this reason is a different question, one that is only obscured by introducing ’objective’ reasons into the picture that are somehow different from normative reasons.

2. Actually it is a little unclear to me how ’interest’-based reasons are supposed to be vindicated by Williams’ account, insofar as some people’s subjective motivational sets might be such that they just don’t care about satisfying their future desires, and no amount of improved information and careful reflection would generate a concern for future satisfactions.

3. Joyce devotes three chapters to the discussion of reasons. But chaps. 3 and 4 are mostly devoted to inconclusive skirmishing with Smith, culminating in the suggestion that the burden of proof is on the side of those who hold that there are reasons that all rational agents would converge in acknowledging. Chap. 5 responds to a number of critics of Williams’ internal reasons account without really engaging systematically with the issues in the theory of rational motivation that are alleged to support the claim that all reasons are grounded in agents’ subjective interests and desires.

4. There is a more technical question about how exactly this is supposed to work. Does Joyce mean to say that the (false) thought that an action is wrong, and that its wrongness is a categorical reason for action, can motivate us to act accordingly? If so, then it would seem that cognitions alone can motivate us to act, and this appears to call into question the Humeanism about motivation that Joyce relies on in his argument against categorical reasons.

5. Joyce might contend that this is tantamount to abolitionism, but that would be to reassert the monolithic view of morality I am rejecting here. There is a nontrivial sense in which decency, respect, justice, and so on are moral values, a sense that does not simply derive from the thought that these values are sources of categorical requirements. We might put this by saying that a commitment to promote values of these kinds is an independent non-negotiable part of morality as we understand it. Hence someone who lives in the spirit of these values, while acknowledging that they do not provide categorical reasons, has not given up on morality altogether.