The Myth of the Intuitive: Experimental Philosophy and Philosophical Method

Placeholder book cover

Max Deutsch, The Myth of the Intuitive: Experimental Philosophy and Philosophical Method, MIT Press, 2015, 194pp., $37.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262028950.

Reviewed by Don Loeb, The University of Vermont


Max Deutsch's book is a spirited and engaging response to a prominent challenge, grounded in empirical research, to philosophy itself.[1] The challenge starts with the assumption that most or all philosophical reasoning relies heavily upon intuitions, typically the results of thought experiments, as evidence. The challenge is that intuitions, in particular the intuitions thought to underlie many central philosophical arguments, seem to vary in response to factors that by all accounts have nothing to do with their truth.

Deutsch has doubts about the quality of some of the evidence for the claim that intuitions vary in the ways experimental philosophers have said they do. But, for the most part, he sets those doubts aside here. Instead, he argues that contrary to a widely-held misconception philosophical arguments do not depend on intuitions and philosophers don't rely on them. He calls the view that philosophers do rely on intuitions the myth of the intuitive and the main point of the book is to dispel this myth. To accomplish this, Deutsch painstakingly considers some of the most prominent philosophical arguments often thought to depend upon intuitions, aiming to show that these arguments (and by extension philosophical arguments in general) do not rely on intuitions after all.

This is a fun and interesting book and it addresses a well-known and serious, though still very preliminary, challenge to philosophical thinking itself. It is fascinating, ingenious, careful, and very thought provoking. It can also be a bit maddening. Despite all the care and precision with which Deutsch formulates his claims, one still gets the impression that at times he and his targets are talking past one another. The reader has to work too hard in order to figure out how the pieces fit together. Most importantly, it's never made fully clear why the experimental results are thought irrelevant to the philosophical enterprise even as Deutsch (re)describes it.

Although it's hard to say exactly what makes something an intuition, we can all recognize the sorts of cases in which philosophers appear to be relying on them. Indeed, some philosophers would claim that appeals to intuitions, however we understand them, are at the core of almost every philosophical argument. Famous instances include Gettier cases and Kripke's thought experiments about reference, and Deutsch devotes considerable attention to these. In the Gettier cases, for example, the theory that knowledge is justified true belief is threatened, we might think, by the widespread intuition that in certain situations, although an individual has a justified true belief that p, nevertheless the individual has no knowledge that p.

Recently, appeals to intuition in philosophy have faced a serious challenge. One of experimental philosophy's showcase "negative" projects attempts to undermine our confidence in intuitions of the sort philosophers are thought to rely upon. Surveys suggest that people's intuitions about certain cases of great philosophical interest might be affected by factors that are unrelated to the intuitions' truth.[2] For example, if people from one part of the world have the intuition that the individual described in a particular scenario does not have knowledge, but people from another part of the world have a contrary intuition, then (at least for that case, and other things being equal) intuitions seem like an unreliable source of evidence.

Examples like this are plentiful in the literature of experimental philosophy.[3] Moreover, our intuitions appear to vary with respect to a host of such truth-irrelevant factors, including framing, order of presentation, geography/culture, and many others.[4] Unless there is some way of eliminating the irrelevant influences, it might seem unreasonable to rely on intuitions in some or all philosophical argumentation. And if intuitions are as critical as is widely believed, then philosophy itself appears to be threatened.

There are well known responses to this research.[5] The negative program is still in its early stages, and the replication crisis has not entirely spared experimental philosophy.[6] Deutsch points to other issues, offering a helpful explanation of what he calls pragmatic distortion, in which contextual features of the way a survey question is posed can cause one population to interpret the question differently than another. Although Deutsch has interesting things to say about these issues, for the most part he takes a different tack. He claims that philosophers don't rely on intuitions.[7] Thus, the experimentalist critique is simply beside the point.

To make the claim that philosophers don't rely on intuitions more precise Deutsch points to an important ambiguity. For there is a sense in which he thinks it undeniable that philosophers do rely on intuitions, the content sense:

(EC2) Many philosophical arguments treat the contents of certain intuitions as evidence for or against other contents (e.g., the contents of more general principles). (36)

Call intuitive claims that are treated this way CONTENT intuitions. What Deutsch denies is that philosophers rely on intuitions in what he calls the state sense. He denies that:

(EC1) Many philosophical arguments treat the fact that certain contents are intuitive as evidence for those very contents. (36)

Call intuitive claims that are treated this way STATE intuitions.

As Deutsch sees it, the myth of the intuitive is that philosophers rely on STATE intuitions. It is no myth that philosophers rely on CONTENT intuitions, claims they find intuitive.[8] What Deutsch denies is that philosophers treat the intuitiveness of those claims as evidence that the claims are correct. But if the experimental results are relevant to anything, Deutsch believes, they are relevant only to STATE intuitions and not to CONTENT intuitions. Since philosophers don't appeal to STATE intuitions the experimental results are irrelevant.

But why think that the experimental results are relevant only to STATE intuitions? This is a question to which Deutsch's answer should have been clearer, but I think what he has in mind is roughly this. To say that philosophers do not appeal to STATE intuitions is to say that philosophers never say (nor think, nor behave as though they think) things like, "One should believe p because it's intuitive." According to the experimentalist critique of intuitions, whether or not people find a particular proposition intuitive can be affected by factors unrelated to its truth. Thus, to argue that we should believe something because it is intuitive would be to expose one's argument to that critique, since whether or not it is intuitive might be the product of the sorts of distorting factors the critique calls our attention to.[9] Since any intuition could be to some degree the product of those factors, the fact that people find a proposition intuitive gives us at most questionable evidence for the proposition's truth.[10]

But since philosophers don't claim that a proposition's being intuitive is evidence for its truth, they needn't worry about what caused anyone to find it intuitive. Philosophers give reasons for thinking their intuitive claims true, "evidence for the evidence," instead of relying on the claims' intuitiveness. They appeal to arguments in support of their intuitive claims, and the experimentalist critique doesn't say anything about the quality of those arguments.

Return, for example, to the Gettier case. Suppose one is presented with a hypothetical scenario and judges that the subject in that scenario doesn't know that p. It would be natural to ask what justifies one's claim that the subject doesn't know. If one is relying on a STATE intuition (relying on the fact that one has the intuition) one ought to respond that one is justified in believing that the subject doesn't know that p because it is intuitive that the subject doesn't know that p.[11] But if whether or not it is intuitive depends on factors having nothing to do with its truth, then intuitions about the case seem unreliable as premises of an argument about knowledge (or anything).

Alternatively, one might be relying on a CONTENT intuition. In this case one takes the intuited claim as true, but does not take the fact that one intuits it as evidence that it is true. Still, one could give reasons for thinking the intuited claim is true. And indeed one could give reasons for those reasons, etc. In fact, giving reasons is just what Gettier did and what philosophers in general do, as careful examination of their arguments shows. For example, Gettier says:

But it is equally clear that Smith does not know that (e) is true; for (e) is true in virtue of the number of coins in Smith's pocket, while Smith does not know how many coins are in Smith's pocket, and bases his belief in (e) on a count of the coins in Jones's pocket, whom he falsely believes to be the man who will get the job.[12]

The claim that one's response to the hypothetical is intuitive is simply not part of the philosophical argument. Since philosophers are ultimately relying upon reasons and not intuitions, the fact that intuitions of either sort might be the product of distorting influences is irrelevant to any evaluation of their arguments. Philosophy as we know it is saved.

I want to discuss two worries I have about Deutsch's argument. The first is pretty obvious, and Deutsch raises it himself. Suppose it is true that the intuitive premises on which philosophers rely are themselves supported by arguments (and not by the claim that those premises are intuitive). Still, the supporting arguments have premises too and philosophers might be accepting those premises because they are intuitive. For example, Deutsch glosses Gettier's argument as relying on "an all but explicitly proposed necessary condition on knowledge," that a knower's true belief can't merely be "luckily true" (88-89). What is Gettier's (or our) justification for the premise that knowledge can't be a matter of luck? Perhaps the answer is that the premise is justified because it's intuitive! Or if the premise itself is supported by argument, then perhaps it is the premises of that argument that involve appeal to STATE intuitions. Somewhere down the line, one might think, we wind up with the same problem we began with, that ultimately we must appeal to STATE intuitions. Deutsch calls this the relocation problem, and devotes considerable attention to its resolution.

He offers three replies.[13] First, relocating the problem means that the experimental work conducted so far has been focused in the wrong place. What's missing is research on people's ultimate premises, those foundational claims for which no further argument is given. This reply seems weak to me. It won't be long before the experimentalists get around to testing the evidence for the evidence, and it would be somewhat surprising if irrelevant factors didn't have an impact there as well.[14]

Another reply is that the problem of ultimate justifiers is a worry for all knowledge, not just for philosophical knowledge, and it would be inappropriate to treat the relocation problem as a demand for an answer to that general epistemological worry. But the experimentalist isn't seeking answers to questions about whether our beliefs are ever justified or whether knowledge has foundations. All she wants to know is whether the justifications for certain philosophical claims rely upon intuitions somewhere down the line. That might be a difficult question but it is a much more tractable one.

Deutsch's final point is that philosophical arguments might not bottom out in foundational claims, and even if they do it would still need to be shown that philosophers treat the fact that those claims are intuitive as evidence for their truth. It is tempting to reply that intuitiveness has to be playing a justificatory role somewhere, whether that role is acknowledged or not. If one believes oneself to be justified in accepting a given proposition, but one wouldn't accept that proposition but for the fact that it is intuitively plausible, then perhaps one is committed to treating its intuitive plausibility as part of one's evidence.

Even if intuitive plausibility is not part of our evidence, however, we are nevertheless likely to be affected by it. And that brings me to my second, deeper worry. Suppose philosophers do not rely on STATE intuitions, but only on CONTENT intuitions (intuitively plausible claims those philosophers don't think are justified in virtue of their intuitiveness). And suppose further that philosophers rely on CONTENT intuitions only when those intuitions are supported by arguments. Still, although intuitiveness is not part of our justification for relying on those CONTENT intuitions it almost surely plays a causal role in bringing us to accept them, and that's where the worry arises.[15] After all, the whole point of the negative project is to show that factors not part of the justification -- epistemically irrelevant factors -- have an impact on which propositions people accept.

Focusing on the evidence for philosophical claims may thus be barking up the wrong tree, for it obscures what experimentalists have been stressing, that human beings are responsive to factors that have nothing to do with evidence. Even if one has an argument for a particular proposition, whether one accepts the argument depends on how plausible one finds its premises and conclusion. But plausibility is affected by truth-irrelevant factors. How much that counts against accepting philosophical claims when arguments for them are present is a difficult and as-yet-unanswered question with both empirical and philosophical dimensions.

The jury is still out. Experimental work on intuitions is still in its early stages. Much more needs to be done, and The Myth of the Intuitive will help experimentalists to formulate their questions more carefully. There is still a great deal we don't know about how widespread and irremediable the distorting factors are, especially in the context of philosophical argumentation. Moreover, as Deutsch's discussion shows, we need to be much more careful both in how we formulate our arguments and how we understand them when we are considering philosophical methodology. For anyone wishing to think seriously about these issues, The Myth of the Intuitive is required reading.[16]


John Bengson, 2013, "Experimental Attacks on Intuitions and Answers," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 86 (3), pp. 495-532.

Wesley Buckwalter and Stephen Stich, 2014, "Gender and Philosophical Intuition," in Knobe and Nichols, 2014.

Edmund Gettier, 1963, "Is justified true belief knowledge?" Analysis 23, pp. 121-123.

Antti Kauppinen, 2007, "The Rise and Fall of Experimental Philosophy," Philosophical Explorations 10 (2), pp. 95-118.

Minsun Kim & Yuan Yuan, 2015, "No cross-cultural differences in the Gettier car case intuition: A replication study of Weinberg et al. 2001," Episteme 12 (3), pp. 355-361.

Joshua Knobe and Shaun Nichols, eds., 2014, Experimental Philosophy, Vol. 2, Oxford University Press.

Edouard Machery, Ron Mallon, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich, 2004, "Semantics, Cross-Cultural Style," Cognition 92, pp.1-12.

Ron Mallon, Edouard Machery, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich, 2009, "Against Arguments from Reference," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79, pp. 332-356.

Eric Schwitzgebel and Fiery Cushman, 2012, "Expertise in Moral Reasoning? Order Effects on Moral Judgment in Professional Philosophers and Non-Philosophers," Mind and Language 27 (2), pp. 135-153.

Eric Schwitzgebel and Fiery Cushman, 2015, "Philosophers' biased judgments persist despite training, expertise and reflection," Cognition 141, pp. 127-37.

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, ed., 2008a, Moral Psychology: The Cognitive Science of Morality: Intuition and Diversity. (Volume 2), MIT Press.

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, 2008b, "Framing Moral Intuitions" in Sinnott-Armstrong 2008a, pp. 47-76.

Stacey Swain, Joshua Alexander, and Jonathan M. Weinberg, 2008, "The Instability of Philosophical Intuitions: Running Hot and Cold on Truetemp," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76, pp. 138-155.

Jonathan M. Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich, 2001, "Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions," Philosophical Topics, pp. 429-460.

[1] More specifically, Deutsch focusses on analytic "philosophy as it has traditionally been practiced," but he uses "philosophy" as shorthand. (55, 163, n.1)

[2] Strictly speaking, the critique can't depend simply on intuitions having what Deutsch calls, "truth-irrelevant variability". Presumably, for example, what people intuit depends on truth-irrelevant factors such as whether or not they are intoxicated or in horrible pain. Deutsch ignores this complexity. I thank Louis deRossett for reminding me of it.

[3] See, for example, Weinberg, et al., 2001; Machery, et al., 2004; Swain, et al., 2008; and Mallon, et al., 2009.

[4] Sinnott-Armstrong, 2008a (framing); Swain et al., 2008 (order of presentation); Weinberg et al., 2001 (geography/culture); and Buckwalter and Stich, 2014 (gender).

[5] See, for example, Kauppinen, 2007; Bengson, 2013.

[6] See, for example, Kim and Yuan, 2015.

[7] Sometimes Deutsch is more cautious, saying for example that, "intuitions are accorded no, or very little, evidential status in arguments in philosophy." (79) At other points he's less so, for example saying that, "intuitiveness does not play even a small evidential role in any philosophical argument" (77) and repeatedly saying that he knows of no case in which an appeal is made to "brute intuitions about cases". (114)

[8] Indeed, Deutsch thinks that the fact that philosophers rely on CONTENT intuitions helps to explain the appeal of the myth that philosophers rely on STATE intuitions. (37)

[9] Calling these distorting factors raises the question, "Distorting from what?" One fairly neutral answer is that they are distortions from what one would intuit if not for the influence of the irrelevant factors.

[10] Deutsch claims that the experimentalist critique assumes (though not explicitly) that intuitions are treated as essential evidence, the sort without which one would be unjustified in holding a given belief. The reason is that it would be much less interesting (and inconsistent with x phi rhetoric) to criticize intuitions if one takes them to be of only minor evidentiary importance. But Deutsch is overlooking the fact that there is plenty of room between treating intuitions as essential evidence and treating them as only of minor evidentiary importance. (Still, as he has reminded me, experimentalists treat the evidence as strong enough to support suspending judgment on, for example, "the Gettier intuition".)

[11] Note that the claim that a proposition is intuitive is ambiguous: Intuitive for whom? Deutsch reads it as the claim that people in general find it intuitive. (132) But philosophers who treat intuitions as evidence might well be concerned only with their own intuitions and those of their audience.

[12] Gettier, 1963, p. 122 quoted in Deutsch, p. 81.

[13] Deutsch's response to the relocation problem is (perhaps somewhat awkwardly) divided between two chapters.

[14] In fact, some recent research suggests that even when given an opportunity to reflect carefully, philosophers are not immune to the influence of certain distorting factors. Cushman and Schwitzgebel, 2012, 2015.

[15] To be fair, sometimes experimentalists speak as though their critique is directed at intuitions used as evidence: "We take the growing body of empirical data impugning various intuitions to present a real challenge for philosophers who wish to rely on intuitions as evidence." Swain, et al., 2008, p. 153, quoted in Deutsch, p. 20.

[16] I'm very grateful to Mark Alfano, Louis deRossett, Max Deutsch, John Doris, Kate Nolfi, Barbara Rachelson, Eric Schwitzgebel, and Folke Tersman for reading drafts of this review (on very short notice) and to the editors for their patience in waiting to receive it.