The Myth of the Moral Brain: The Limits of Moral Enhancement

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Harris Wiseman, The Myth of the Moral Brain: The Limits of Moral Enhancement, MIT Press, 2016, 337pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262033923.

Reviewed by Norbert Paulo, University of Salzburg


There are various ways in which humans try, and have always tried, to become morally better. Traditional means of moral enhancement include civic education, the criminal justice system, self-awareness seminars, and ethics courses. Recent years have seen increased discussion of the potential of non-traditional biomedical means to enhance humans morally. For instance, it has been suggested that the hormone oxytocin makes people more social. In his far-ranging book, Harris Wiseman takes a cautious view and laments the fact that most proponents of such non-traditional moral enhancements fail to understand the complexity of morality when they ascribe an explanatory primacy to biological influences. In doing so they neglect "supervening social-environmental and personal influences" (17) on moral functioning. Wiseman's main goal is to provide a realistic picture of the prospects of moral enhancement; he takes all of these influences into account and proposes a "bio-psycho-social" (245) model of moral enhancement.

He turns, so to speak, the moral enhancement debate off its head, on which it was standing, and places it upon its feet. The book will particularly interest those who want to learn about practical obstacles to implementing moral enhancement policies, or about holistic approaches to "true" or "deep" moral enhancement. It begins with a critical discussion of three prominent theories of moral enhancement (Ch. 2 and 3). Against this background Wiseman develops his own model of moral enhancement, which places biomedical means of moral enhancement within a social setting closely resembling religious communities under pastoral care (Ch. 6-10). Chapters 4 and 5 are an interesting interlude in which Wiseman engages more closely, and very critically, with the current mainstream in cognitive sciences -- underlying much of the debate on moral enhancement and current moral psychology -- which tries to understand the "moral brain" in biological terms alone. (I do not discuss these two chapters here because they do not significantly contribute to Wiseman's overall argument.)

The three theories of moral enhancement discussed in the first chapters are those of Ingmar Persson and Julian Savulescu, James Hughes, and Tom Douglas. Let me here focus on Persson and Savulescu (P&S), because their proposal is used as the prime antagonist throughout the book. In a series of co-authored articles and in their book Unfit for the Future, P&S argue that humankind's moral dispositions are still those that evolved when humankind lived in small hunter-gatherer societies. However, they are not fit for living in today's globalized world with its increased possibilities for inflicting tremendous harm on others. Amongst other deficiencies, humans unreasonably discount the future and lack the capacity to feel empathy with far-away people in the same way they feel with those near to them. These temporal and geographical parochialisms, P&S argue, are but two reasons why humankind does not take the measures necessary to solve problems such as drastic climate change. Since traditional means of moral enhancement do not seem to suffice for the mega-problems of today, we should change ourselves by all effective (and safe) means available. And when we do not have such means, we should start thorough research programs into effective biomedical moral enhancers.

P&S's proposal has been criticized for various reasons. It has been argued that enhancers merely manipulate people's behavior and emotional responses, but do not make people more moral, for true moral behavior includes the "freedom to fall." P&S's idea has also been criticized because it would violate individual human rights. Moreover, their proposal is problematic on a political level, first because it is incompatible with basic egalitarian ideas, and, second, because it undermines democratic legitimacy -- a democratic government cannot rule legitimately by manipulating the will of the people.

Wiseman's critique, in contrast, is rather pragmatic. His main point seems to be that moral enhancement could never be as effective as P&S would need it to be to solve the mega-problems of today. "No moral enhancement that we can realistically envisage can turn a person into a 'moral robot,' thankfully, thus ensuring that free choice will always remain, no matter how compulsory or powerful the moral enhancement intervention will be" (39). In Wiseman's strongly worded critique, P&S's ideas appear foolish. Towards the end of the book, the author even concludes that "the hideous visage of Persson and Savulescu's Unfit for the Future (2012), the thesis of which is, literally, enhance or die, has really made a joke of this domain" of moral enhancement (263).

According to Wiseman, biomedical means might well be part of the solution, but they will not solve any of the big problems faced by humankind. He stresses that moral enhancement is not currently practically feasible. Potential enhancers such as oxytocin, propranolol, or serotonin do not even come close to fully determining the behavior of persons. A bad guy with control over a nuke could, however enhanced, still cause tremendous harm. More effective enhancers are, moreover, not likely to be developed, because the pharmaceutical industry does not have a sufficient financial incentive to invest in research on moral enhancement (66-71). Another point is that those most in need of moral enhancement are least likely to be willing to use enhancers. For some of the most pressing problems, this only leaves us with the option of compulsory moral enhancement. However, "the reality at present is that the general public in Europe and America do not even trust their governments to be sufficiently competent to manage the yearly flu shot correctly" (62). So, people are unlikely to support state-driven compulsory moral enhancement. Given these practical problems, Wiseman calls for a more realistic and feasible model of moral enhancement -- one that neither over- nor underestimates the potential of biomedical means to make us more moral; but also one that recognizes social and individual influences on moral functioning.

Before I lay out Wiseman's own proposal, let me briefly highlight two problems with his critique of P&S. First, as far as I know, all proponents of moral enhancement -- and certainly P&S -- say that such enhancers might contribute to more moral motivation or behavior, not that they alone will do the whole job. Just as doping without hard training will not get me to the Olympics, pure moral enhancement will not turn me into a moral role model. Second, P&S, as I understand them, primarily argue for research into moral enhancement. They are very clear about the fact that we are unlikely to have powerful and safe moral enhancers in the near future. But is this sufficient reason to not intensify research as long as there is some hope that human morality might be significantly affected by biomedical means? After all, P&S's argument is a -- more or less ideal -- philosophical one, not a policy recommendation to be implemented right away. Thus understood, P&S's and Wiseman's more practice-oriented proposal are not necessarily adversaries. One might well opt for Wiseman-type moral enhancement policies now and support P&S-type research into biomedical enhancers for the future.

Wiseman's own model of moral enhancement tries to strike a balance between too much and too little confidence in biomedical means to enhance people morally. Yet he insists that

biomedical moral enhancement, and the biological dimensions of moral functioning more generally, constantly need to be understood as having a dynamic and integral but, most importantly, auxiliary relationship with the various psycho-social and environmental backgrounds in which any given intervention is to be embedded. That is . . . the tremendous plurality of potential social-environmental influences on moral functioning will be presented as significantly more important in shaping moral functioning than the various biological or neurobiological influences they are interwoven with. (16)

The book makes the case against all kinds of reductionism, whether biological, cultural, or individual. Wiseman holds that our moral functioning is biologically mediated (but not determined); that we still have the capacity for transcendence (without being absolutely free); and that we are influenced (but not fully determined) socially (17).

In this generality, these points are hardly deniable (except, perhaps, the primacy of social-environmental influences stipulated in the last quote). Wiseman lays out his model of moral enhancement as one mirroring traditional moral education in a religious setting. One reason for this is integral to Wiseman's practical aims. It is simply a fact that religious thought and practice shape the moral understanding and behavior of billions of people around the world. Moral enhancement thus needs to be possible in such religious settings. Chapter 6 lays out in some detail how religious institutions can shape moral education. The picture presented there is predominantly Christian but also makes reference to other faiths. The takeaway message is that, in a Christian setting, (life-long) moral education has to do with becoming a moral person living within a certain community. This is a vision of practically lived and deeply embodied virtues. Personal contemplation, social embeddedness, and moral practices play the key roles:

the totality of the human creature's bodily powers must be brought to bear [on moral formation]. A moral identity or character is required, which can only be formed through engaged practice, the shaping of the reasoning mind and congruence of the emotions formed through habituation, and done, necessarily, with the support of a larger social scaffolding, the worshipping community, which, in ideal circumstances, has the power to motivate the taking on of specifically Christian values and is capable of sustaining the identities of its members precisely as Christian. (166-7)

This outline of moral education in a distinct Christian setting will remind those familiar with Christian life and theology of the many facets of Christian moral formation. Those less familiar with this tradition will learn a great deal from Wiseman's very accessible presentation. Most readers will find out about traditional means of moral enhancement in this Christian setting for the first time, for example about psychologically and sociologically informed pastoral means of value-preference modification and about the deliberate use of exemplars and apprenticeship in fostering identity formation within a community (164-5). It is important for Wiseman that all of this is not philosophical speculation, but a model of moral formation that has developed in practice over a long time and that shapes the lives of billions of people.

Chapters 7-9 connect this model to the idea of moral enhancement through non-traditional biomedical means. Given the complexity of moral formation in a religious setting, moral enhancement cannot function in a "one size fits all" manner (174). For example, neuro-economist Paul Zak has conducted trust-game studies about the influence of oxytocin on charitable giving. These studies reveal that oxytocin has a significant influence. But Wiseman argues that, with their simple setting, these studies cannot even grasp the complexity of a simple moral concept such as charitable giving:

What of the idea of charitable giving as an expression of humanity? . . . Or, less palatably, what of the more charismatic religious notions of charity qua giving monies in transaction terms (e.g., . . . 'giving money = I love God')? . . . The conceptual scaffolding of charitable giving involves aspects of duty and of discipline, which represent independent moral goods that have nothing at all to do with 'wanting' to be generous. This is not a matter of Christian self-punishment, but rather it is about awareness of the simple fact that living a moral life involves doing things that one does not want to do, and this is something that needs to be practiced. (176-7)

That is, it is not something that can be attained by biomedical means alone.

The role of biomedical means is rather limited in Wiseman's model of moral enhancement. Most of the job is done by individual transcendence and by the respective religious community. To illustrate what can be achieved with biomedical means Wiseman points to the treatment of alcohol addiction. The idea is that alcoholism is morally problematic because it can lead to domestic violence or general belligerence and it diminishes one's moral capacities (e.g. for reflection and self-control). Treating alcoholism would thus make the world a better place, even though it is primarily remedial (and does not enhance moral capacities beyond normality). A number of potential therapies to "cure" alcoholism are introduced, among them a gene therapy that generates something like an allergy to alcohol (similar to "Asian flush", 229-33). But Wiseman prefers a treatment that is already tested and available, namely the administration of the opioid system modulator nalmefene, which reduces alcohol consumption significantly.

One problem is that, unlike an alcohol allergy, nalmefene is only effective for 8-9 hours. Patients thus need to overcome their addiction again and again, every single day, which is precisely the problem with addictions. The voluntary use of nalmefene is thus unlikely to be effective if undertaken individually. Yet the compulsory use of nalmefene would be regarded as condemnable hard paternalism by the public. It would also undermine the individual's prospects for moral growth. The ideal is an alcoholic who freely decides to fight his or her addiction and seeks help from others to support the "cure." In the Christian setting Wiseman uses to illustrate what an integrating approach to moral enhancement can look like, the addict would aim at

growing as a Christian person. . . . Thus, dealing with alcohol addiction may not focus on . . . wanting to be sober, but rather it may focus on wanting to spend more time with one's family, repair destroyed relations, be a healthier person -- all of which are incongruent with the alcoholic imbibing their beverage of choice. (246)

 Wiseman continues to outline pastoral approaches to illustrate how the religious community can help the addict take nalmefene every single day. Prayer and meditation have their role, but arguably most important is the support from a suffering community, "wherein the very act of sharing experiences, conversing, and mutual encouragement help sustain and bolster the motivation of participants" (248).

As sensible as all this sounds, a couple of worries remain. The strength of this model is that it is feasible for many purposes and is already in use. But, again, to what extent does this exclude alternative approaches, more utopic and imaginative, such as those of the authors Wiseman criticizes? And, given the reality of more and more anonymous Western societies in which social and communal ties are severed for many reasons, is this not a romantically distorted picture of bygone days with strong moral communities? More to the point, Wiseman sometimes says that his model is empirically informed by sociology and psychology, but he only very rarely goes into details or provides references outside of theology. This point is not mere nagging, for the setting Wiseman envisions for moral formation seems to be working for all kinds of personal formation -- also for extremely immoral ones. It might well be helpful in complying more perfectly with valid norms; but it seems less likely to be helpful in getting a better understanding of the moral virtues (e.g. by dismissing an understanding of the honor of women as focused on chastity and submissiveness), in fostering proper demoralization (i.e., learning to regard as morally permissible what one believed to be wrong), or in getting a better understanding of moral standing and moral statuses (of all genders, say), all of which have recently been discussed as types of moral progress. The problem -- as Wiseman at times acknowledges -- is that religious groups are usually rather conservative and do not promote moral progress.


Many thanks to Christoph Bublitz and Lando Kirchmair for commenting on an earlier draft of this review.