The Natural and the Human: Science and the Shaping of Modernity, 1739-1841

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Stephen Gaukroger, The Natural and the Human: Science and the Shaping of Modernity, 1739-1841, Oxford University Press, 2016, 402pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199757634.

Reviewed by Phillip R. Sloan, University of Notre Dame


This third volume of Stephen Gaukroger's massive synthesis of the history of science, philosophy, and intellectual history since 1210, continues a general thematic across the Enlightenment-Romanticism boundary, and also moves from a primary focus on the physical sciences into medicine, natural history, and anthropology. Although it is possible to view each volume in this series as self-contained, their incorporation in a more general breathtaking synthesis at the hands of one scholar requires some attention to the larger project.

The goals of this long study are pursued along two fronts. One thematic is to be an analysis of the interplay of natural philosophy and epistemology in a historical dialogue with the Christian religious tradition since the medieval period. The general aim is to understand how the epistemic values of natural philosophy, and later "science," came to displace Christian theology and classical Humanism as the primary form of knowing, the default for assessing the claims of ethics, politics, religion, and philosophy.

The second thematic is to discuss the growing "disunity" of science as one follows the fragmentation of an original unified project achieved in the seventeenth century in Cartesianism. This subsequent breakup in the eighteenth century takes place with the rise of experimentalism in company with Newtonian critiques of the mechanical philosophy. As this claim is put in Volume I:

Since the assumption of the unity of science underlies not only reductionist programmes, but the assimilation of cognitive disciplines to science . . .  it inevitably plays a key role in understanding how science has taken on a particular foundational standing. (Emergence, p. 16)

In setting out this project, Gaukroger has been concerned to avoid a triumphalist historiography of science that views the modern hegemony of scientific rationality to lie in the discovery of new methodologies based on empiricism and experimentalism, in the success of technology, and in the new social organization of scientific forms of knowing. Countering this explicit or implicit historiographical stance is the claim that a historical alliance of natural philosophy with Christian theology in some form has been the key to this development of modern science in the West:

I have set out to clear the ground by showing that the reasons commonly adduced for the success of a scientific culture in the West in the wake of the Scientific Revolution -- its use of adversarial non-dogmatic argument, its ability to dissociate itself from religion, its technological benefits -- are mistaken and cannot explain this success. Indeed, a distinctive feature of the Scientific Revolution is that, unlike other earlier scientific programmes and cultures, it is driven, often explicitly, by religious considerations: Christianity set the agenda for natural philosophy in many respects and projected it forward in a way quite different from that of any other scientific culture. Moreover, when the standing of religion as a source of knowledge about the world, and cognitive values generally, came to be threatened, it was not science that posed the threat but history. (Emergence, p. 3)

But this is not an apologetic project. If this alliance of science and religion was the key to the original social legitimation of science as a way to truth, Gaukroger is concerned to demonstrate how this alliance breaks down in the eighteenth and early nineteenth century through a profound process of "naturalization," both of the human being and also of Christianity. This naturalization will be achieved across a wide area of Western culture by the early nineteenth century. Fleshing out these large claims in exhaustive detail has now occupied Gaukroger for three major volumes, with more projected.

In developing on the religion-science theme, Gaukroger expands without critique the thesis of Joseph Ben-David, in which Western science is seen to have avoided a rise-decline-new birth pattern evident in other major civilizations.[1] "The 'Scientific Revolution' of the early-modern West breaks with the boom/bust pattern of all other scientific cultures." Instead what emerges in the West "is the uninterrupted and cumulative growth that constitutes the general rule for scientific development in the West since that time." (Emergence, p. 18) Many will, to be sure, question the validity of the Ben-David thesis implicit here, but Gaukroger is not concerned to develop this cross-cultural theme in any detail.

Volume II develops in detail the alliance of natural philosophy and Christianity in the early modern period, either through newly-reworked metaphysical foundations, exemplified in Leibnizianism, or through physico-theology as developed particularly in the British tradition by John Ray, Robert Boyle, and William Derham. These served to legitimate the inquiry of natural philosophers and gave the new science this cumulative impetus.

Volume II also detailed the way in which the epistemological assumptions of the mechanical philosophy succumbed to the critiques of Newtonianism after 1690. It is also around the Newtonian alternative to the comprehensive mechanical philosophy of Descartes that we see the "disunity of science" theme emerging. The matter theory of the new chemistry is not that of traditional mechanism. Newtonianism introduces new active forces and causal principles, with increasing emphasis on the aether. A new explanatory epistemology arising particularly with Locke and the experimentalism of the Royal Society moves away from explanations that involve the reduction of phenomena to underlying microstates of matter in mechanical interaction that underlies the mechanical philosophy. Rather than a single Newtonian tradition emerging, there are several lines of inquiry that may pay obeisance to the great Newton, but have no deeper unification. These extend into chemistry, electrical theory, and Newton-inspired medical and scientific vitalism. Gaukroger pluralizes the "mechanistic" and "materialistic" readings of Newton described previously in the classic study by Robert Schofield,[2] and now fits these into a larger narrative.

The Natural and the Human generally builds upon the foundations laid in the previous two installments. The first section opens with a chapter devoted to the "dichotomies" of understanding, and is focused on the tensions between the rationalism inherited from the seventeenth-century, grounded on metaphysical dualism and mechanical philosophy, and the new issues opened up by Lockean empiricism and British experimentalism.

This chapter is followed by detailed discussion of the transformations in the theory of matter in the early eighteenth century. This leads the reader through detailed developments in chemistry, and eventually describes how matter, once considered inert, became in the eighteenth century endowed with dynamic and even vital powers.

Section Two then characterizes four distinguishable "naturalizing projects" which eventually draw the human being into the natural world. The first is the development of French "anthropological" medicine, which extended the physiological concept of "sensibility" to include the medical, rational and ethical dimensions of human beings. This theme is treated through particular focus on the medical philosophy developed by the University of Montpellier school, articulated by the medécins philosophes such as Théophile de Bordeu and Paul Barthez . In this Gaukroger synthesizes the important work of such scholars as Charles Wolfe, Roselyne Rey, and Elizabeth Williams and develops a more general thesis as we follow how this "medical philosophy" is expanded in the more general philosophical programs of Pierre Cabanis and Diderot. Gaukroger sees this project finally collapsing under the late century development of Mesmerism, which undermined the philosophical underpinnings of the concept of sensibilité, opening up space for a more experimental approach to the concept of life, one generally rejected by the philosophical medicine of the Montpellier school.

The second thematic explores "naturalization" through the primarily German development of "philosophical" anthropology. This is distinguished from the previous program by its metaphysically-grounded origins emerging from Christian Wolff's massive philosophical synthesis of Leibnizianism. But this naturalizing project develops in opposition to "a fundamental assumption of metaphysical treatments." (p. 174) The "naturalization" here is grounded in the exploitation of Wolff's distinction between "empirical" and "rational" psychology, with the narrative taking us through the views of Alexander Baumgarten, Ernst Platner, and finally Johann Herder, who emerges as the key individual in this chapter. Much of the rest of this chapter deals with Herder's naturalizing project as it intersects with the semiotics of Condillac and Enlightenment aesthetic theory. The chapter closes with an examination of the Herder-Kant conflict, with Kant attempting to resist Herder's naturalizing project through his critique of Herder's metaphysics and his rejection of Herder's pan-vitalism and hylozoism, an effort Gaukroger sees as a failure. It is Herder's naturalizing project that is picked up by nineteenth century Romanticism, not Kant's.

A third naturalizing project is the "natural history of man," developing out of inquiries into natural history, comparative anatomy, classification theory, geological histories of the earth, and comparative biogeography. The sweep of this chapter covers the work of Buffon, Linnaeus, Cuvier, Blumenbach, Montesquieu, Alexander von Humboldt, Voltaire, Adam Ferguson, and Vico. This is addressed in more detail below.

The fourth form of naturalization is pursued through an analysis of the development of social arithmetic, statistical approaches, and emphases on collective, rather than individual, properties.

What makes these collective properties valuable as an object of study varies from case to case, but the way in which it allows causal accounts of behavior is crucial. . . . In doing so, it will provide resources for economic and political theory in the nineteenth century. (p. 301)

In developing this argument, the views of Bernard Mandeville, Adam Smith, Hume, Bentham, Malthus, and Quetelet all come in for discussion.

Section Three concludes the volume with discussion of the "naturalization" of religion. As we have seen from Volumes I and II, the impetus behind the cumulative character of the scientific movement in the seventeenth century was deemed to be its alliance with Christian tradition. But in keeping with the original thesis, the "naturalization" of religion takes place not through reductive science and mechanical philosophy, but through historical thinking. This narrative leads us through the early development of historical critiques of religion by Hume, the rise of Romantic aestheticism, and the reduction of Christianity to humanism by David Friederich Strauss and Ludwig Feuerbach. Gaukroger's concluding point sums up a complex argument:

One thing that is clear is that we cannot think of naturalization as being primarily a relationship between the natural sciences and other disciplines. Materialism and reduction to the natural sciences play a very small and inessential role in the forms of naturalization. . . . Indeed, the most powerful naturalizing resource, in the sense of the one that led most effectively to the replacement of basic traditional beliefs about the world and our place in it, was history. The power of history lay in its ability to do something that was wholly outside the resources of reductive forms of naturalization, namely to engage non-propositional forms of understanding. (p. 351)

As can be seen from this brief précis, the scope of Gaukroger's project is immense. His scholarship draws on primary sources in at least four languages, and extensive secondary commentary, much of it recent. Gaukroger typically proceeds by a focus on a few key individuals and their works as central nodes in developing this story -- Descartes, Newton, Leibniz, Locke, Hume, Diderot, Gibbon, Mandeville, Herder, Kant, Hegel, Strauss, Feuerbach -- around which he weaves a larger narrative.

Where general criticisms can be, and have been, raised is with the more general historiography and method of proceeding. Gaukroger is doing classical "history of philosophy-cum-history of ideas," with the deficiencies of this approach often noted in the literature. We have large concepts at work -- "science," "culture," "metaphysics," "experimentalism," "epistemology," and "anthropology" -- organizing the discussion. Often only loose connections are drawn between the proponents singled out for discussion. There are on occasion sudden leaps in chronology. Predictably he has been criticized for ignoring social and institutional history.[3]

But such criticisms confront anyone trying to cover such a large intellectual landscape. Rather than emphasizing difficulties facing the writers of "Big History," I acknowledge my deep appreciation for it. The copious footnotes (yes, footnotes, not annoying endnotes), typically citing the most recent scholarship and the key primary sources relevant to the discussion, direct the reader to more detailed studies which he has synthesized in depth. Indeed he has, like Jonathan Israel in his recent discussions of the Enlightenment and French Revolution, been willing once again to foreground ideas, philosophical concepts, and the discussions within high intellectual culture in opposition to fashionable neo-Marxist "bottom up" historiography and the limitation to microhistory. As Gaukroger responded to such criticisms,

If you don't think explicitly about big history, you are condemned to making all kinds of assumptions that may be unfruitful, counterproductive, or just plain ignorant. It is something that every historian has to think about at some stage, and it distinguishes history from antiquarianism.[4]

I find it deeply refreshing to read the effort of a single individual with wide and deep scholarly learning to deal with such a complex array of issues from a coherent organizing perspective.

I will drill down on a few issues to illustrate some of the strengths and weaknesses I found in the book.[5] In his chapter on the "natural history of man," a central claim concerning the difference of this naturalizing approach from the "medical-anthropological" approach of the French is that,

The key to the [natural history of man] lies in a rejection of the idea of order in nature and its replacement by natural relations as guided by, and indeed constituted by, human interests. The human being is embedded in a wholly natural realm and the relationship is reciprocal: the human being gives meaning and significance to nature, but nature in its turn gives meaning and significance to human existence. (p. 234)

This is, we see, an important claim. The natural history of man builds upon a narrowing of the understanding of the natural world to parameters defined by human subjectivity. Eventually this will lead us to Feuerbach.

A central argument leading to this conclusion is drawn from statements of Buffon, who is claimed to be asserting in his Premier discours to the Histoire naturelle (1749), that "if there is to be classification, as there must be for natural history to proceed, one has to give up the idea of natural groupings and instead think of classification as relative to human interests." (p. 220) This "relativizing" of natural order to human subjectivity becomes a keystone in his argument concerning this form of naturalization. It bears directly on the claim of this volume that "the naturalization of the human and the humanization of nature come to be part of the same programme by the nineteenth century" (p. 14).

But to reach this conclusion, it seems that Gaukroger must ignore some considerable texts and secondary scholarship that would see Buffon not as arguing this point, but as attempting to establish, and even in the same text, a way to move away from this reduction of the natural to human subjectivity.[6] This is developed through Buffon's concept of "physical truth" (verité physique), which he opposes to the purely deductive truth of mathematics (verité mathématique) and the abstractions of Linnean taxonomy. The unusual approach to natural history he proceeds to develop from these foundations, leads to the reconceptualization of "physical" species, and to the expanding physical interconnections of organisms with geography and temporality. This moves us away from the claimed reduction of natural historical inquiry to human subjectivity that Gaukroger emphasizes, to what I would claim is a strong Realism in his claims about the physical and material of organic beings to the history of nature. Hence Buffon's distinction between "artificial" and "natural" connections of forms, the point picked up by Kant in his distinction of Naturbeschreibung from Naturgeschichte, seems, to my reading, to be missed.[7]

Assessing the most general claims of this volume pushes us back to the initial premises of the project itself. This has been built on two thematics. One has developed a thesis about the close association of natural philosophy and Christian religion. This association is effectively undermined by naturalization in the late eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. This proceeds by showing that metaphysics, as the traditional bridge between revealed theology and natural philosophy, comes to a dead end in the late eighteenth century. The effort of Leibniz in particular to ground natural philosophy on a deeper metaphysics than the experimentalism and the anti-metaphysical mitigated skepticism of the combination of Locke and Newton is seen to fail. This leaves, it seems, only the physico-theological alternative standing as the support for the connection of religion and science.

The disunity of science thematic is developed implicitly, rather than explicitly, in this volume. What emerges from this narrative is not the image of one synthetic project -- i.e. Newtonianism -- from which these "naturalizations" flow, but instead several distinguishable projects, developing on often incompatible assumptions, that in different ways accomplish a more general reduction of the human to the natural order.

The importance of history in bringing about this naturalization develops on the scientific side with the emergence of historical science and geological "deep time" in the work of Burnet, Buffon, Hutton and Lyell, as outlined briefly in chapter five. These begin by allegorizing Genesis creationism first by Burnet, and then in the major synthesis of Buffon's Époques de la nature of 1779. From another direction, the historical source-criticism that derives from Renaissance Humanists, Spinoza, Richard Simon, and Reimarus does not deal so much with the science-theology relationship, as it does with the claims of the historical validity of revealed texts and the events described within them. I assess Gaukroger's larger narrative to be detailing a two-pronged destruction of the relationship of the Christian tradition and natural science by history -- one coming from scientific developments, which now include historical geology and evolution, and the second from Hume's "natural history" of religion coupled with historical-critical biblical scholarship. It will require future volumes to see how this works out in detail.

Success of the "naturalization of religion" theme of this volume demands the acquiescence in at least two claims: first, it presumes that metaphysics generally failed in its aspiration to ground the new natural philosophy in the Enlightenment, and cannot be revived; secondly, it presumes the inability of the Christian religious tradition to deal with questions raised by the combination of historical and evolutionary science, and biblical historical-critical methods. Both claims, I would suggest, need philosophical justification and cannot be resolved simply by a genealogical analysis.

Such claims will also require attention to the way these issues have been encountered within different traditions in Christianity.

How the unity of science thematic will play out in subsequent volumes can only be hypothesized at this point. We are left at the end of this volume with a picture of multiple projects that have now focused on the human sciences. By the end of the eighteenth century, through these "naturalizations" it is claimed that "science was cut loose from the legitimating culture in which it had found a public rationale." But then how did it avoid the "boom-bust" pattern he outlined in the first volume? His answer is that this involved "an abrupt but fundamental shift in how the tasks of scientific enquiry were conceived, from the natural realm to the human realm." (p. 1) I suspect that we will see in future volumes how there will be renewed efforts to pull these strands back into some unity with the development of Positivism and scientific materialism in the nineteenth century.

Like many, I await the next installment of this magisterial synthesis.

[1] Joseph Ben-David, The Scientists Role In Society. Prentice Hall, 1971, ch. 2. See elaboration on this point in H. Floris Cohen's review of Gaukroger's first two volumes in his "Two New Conceptions of the Scientific Revolution Compared," in the roundtable review by Peter Dear, Daniel Garber, and H. Floris Cohen with Gaukroger's response, Historically Speaking 14 (2) (April 2013),.

[2] Robert Schofield, Mechanism and Materialism: British Natural Philosophy in an Age of Reason. Princeton University Press, 1970.

[3] Peter Dear review, Historically Speaking roundtable.

[4] Gaukroger, "Response," in Historically Speaking roundtable.

[5] "The Gaze of Natural History," in C. Fox, R. Porter, and R. Wokler (eds), Inventing Human Science (University of California Press, 1995), pp. 112-151; "The Essence of Race: Kant and Late Enlightenment Reflections," Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 47 (2014): 191-95.

[6] See especially Thierry Hoquet, Buffon: Histoire naturelle et philosophie. Honoré Champion, 2005, esp. chps. 7-8. See also my "Natural History," in Knud Haakonssen (ed.), The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy (CUP, 2006), II, 903- 921.

[7] See my "Kant on the History of Nature," Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences 37 (2006): 627-48.