The Natural World as a Philosophical Problem

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Jan Patočka, The Natural World as a Philosophical Problem, Ivan Chvatík and Ľubica Učnik (eds.), Erika Abrams (tr.), Northwestern University Press, 2016, 221pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810133617.

Reviewed by Steven Crowell, Rice University


The work of Jan Patočka (1907-1977), Czech philosopher and activist, is still not as well-known as it should be. After finishing his doctorate in Prague in 1933, Patočka studied in Freiburg with Husserl, where he also attended lectures by Heidegger and met Eugen Fink. He returned to Prague to work on his Habilitation, The Natural World as a Philosophical Problem, which was published in 1936. After the war Patočka was barred from teaching, except for a brief time after the "Prague Spring" of 1968. His works -- emphasizing freedom, the critique of ideologies, and a new Europe -- circulated in typescript, he lectured in the "Underground University," and in 1977 he was one of the original signatories of Charter 77, a human rights manifesto. This led to a long interrogation by the police, shortly after which Patočka fell ill and died. Following the "Velvet Revolution" of 1989, the work of collecting and publishing Patočka's writings began at the Patočka Archives in Prague, under the leadership of Ivan Chvatík. German and French translations of many of these works started to appear in the 1990s, and the number of English translations is increasing. The present volume is a very welcome addition to the latter.

The volume's composition reflects this complicated history. At its center is the 1936 Habilitation thesis, devoted to a phenomenology of the "lifeworld," a topic Husserl had introduced in his "Prague Lecture" in 1935. A second Czech edition was published in 1970, to which Patočka appended a lengthy supplement entitled "'The Natural World' Remediated Thirty-Three Years Later," also translated here. In it Patočka explains the very different path his thinking took after 1936, one that sought to preserve the impulse of Husserl's transcendental phenomenology while incorporating motifs from Heidegger, Fink, and Aristotle, whose theory of motion was the topic of Patočka's second Habilitation thesis (1964). In 1976 there appeared a French translation of the 1936 original, with an Afterword -- translated for the present volume -- in which Patočka explains why he did not include the 1970 supplement: "Written in haste, under the pressure of circumstances, the added text falls short" of properly formulating his current view of the problem (182). Shortly after Patočka's death in 1977, Ludwig Landgrebe, one of Husserl's closest students and collaborators, published an homage to Patočka in which he reflected on their long philosophical friendship and offered an interpretation of the development of Patočka's thought. This formed the basis for Landgrebe's Introduction to the third volume of the German edition of Patočka's "Select Works" (1990), translated here as a Foreword.

The volume under review provides an engaging précis of Patočka's powerfully original philosophical approach to nature and illustrates his adept deployment of phenomenological method. Thematically, too, its appearance is timely. Documenting Patočka's passage from transcendental phenomenology (Husserl) through phenomenological ontology (Heidegger) to "metaphysics" or "cosmology" (Fink) -- with "life" as the fils conducteur -- these writings connect with dominant concerns in contemporary phenomenology.[1] In addition, the 1936 text -- whose re-publication in 1970 Patočka defended as a "kind of introduction to philosophy for students" (181) -- remains an excellent concise presentation of transcendental phenomenology. The main concepts of Husserl's mature thought are illuminated by analysis and description rather than exegesis of Husserl's writings and are organized so that what is most original about the phenomenological theme of "world" as "horizon of horizons" becomes evident through direct experience. The 1970 supplement, in turn, explains what motivated Patočka's dissatisfaction with Husserl's view. Phenomenological beginners and Husserl scholars alike can learn much in these pages.

Turning now to the 1936 text, the Introduction and Chapter 1 provide a dramatic presentation of the problem: we moderns lack a unified view of the world. Our everyday, or "natural," experience of the world stands in sharp contrast to the world presented in mathematical natural science, which conceives the former as subjective. This scientific picture undermines our sense of freedom and robs life of meaning, alienating us from ourselves. Patočka describes how attempts to address the problem -- from Descartes and Reid to Russell, Wittgenstein, and logical positivism -- fail, and he rejects any attempt to reduce one world to the other. Instead, the unity must be sought in a third term, prior to both -- "transcendental subjectivity" -- which, as the "activity of creative life," is the world (20-21). Such claims become intelligible only through the phenomenological method of reflection, guided by the epoché and reduction.

Chapter 2 distinguishes phenomenological reflection both from psychology and from the "philosophy of reflection" (Kant, Fichte, Hegel). The philosophy of reflection attains transcendental subjectivity by way of a logical construction that starts with ontological claims ("posited being") and argues to their conditions of possibility. Phenomenological reflection, in contrast, begins by bracketing (epoché) all ontological positing to describe transcendental subjectivity as the experiential "field" or "concrete absolute" (35) in which all posited being is "constituted" in the course of the "lawful process of verifying experience" (40). This transcendental subjectivity or "flowing life" (44) is the "genesis" of being but is not itself a being; rather, the reduction brings it to light in its being-prior, or "pre-existence" (37). The paradoxes in such a view are addressed in subsequent chapters and lead Patočka finally to a version of phenomenological naturalism.

Chapter 3 explores the human being's relation to the world. As embodied creatures we are causally implicated in the rest of nature, but our awareness of this situation follows different, normative, laws. Seen phenomenologically, our "being-in-the-world" is both a perspective on the world and the condition of possibility for things being as they are (56). "World" is not the totality of existing things but the phenomenal connectedness of things, their way of referring beyond themselves to a constitutive whole that Patočka likens to "pure intuition" in Kant's sense (60). Patočka describes a few features of such "horizon intentionality" (66), including its distinction into home and alien (which latter includes nature as the "infinitely strong and chaotic"); its fluctuating temporal rhythms tied to different ages of life; and its meaningful bearing on us through mood (58-60). Because the horizon belongs to transcendental subjectivity, whose basic form is "the flow of original time," the world has the processual character of "becoming." However, this is not a process in the world, and vigilant application of the epoché is necessary to avoid reification (77-78).

Within this general framework, Patočka focuses more closely on how the world of what Husserl called the "natural attitude" is constituted. Its "fundamental layer" consists in the things of sense-perception, "articulated" in teleological-practical ways. This layer is not sui generis, however, but originates in constitutive achievements that are not articulated but only "presented" -- namely, manifolds of sense qualities (68). In describing this origin, what might be called Patočka's "neo-naturalism" becomes evident. Building on motifs found in Husserl's late work, Patočka holds that the "passive synthesis" of sensuous manifolds is not a function of mere association in the flow of original time but is structured by various "original tendencies" that belong to embodied life (72). Organic tendencies yield primitive "unities" of sense thanks to the "life-functions" they fulfill (76). Genuine object-unity (perceptual re-identification of particulars) also derives from an original tendency, one possessed only in the human form of life, since norm-governed re-identification requires freedom.

Chapter 4, then, investigates how language originates from freedom and makes theory and science possible. The corrosive power of the scientific picture of the world derives not from theoretical objectification but from mathematization, the dream of a complete "emancipation" from the "presupposition" of natural language (86). Patočka's approach here recalls that of Merleau-Ponty, triangulating between empirical psychology, the Prague School of linguistics, and phenomenological reflection to show how language as "objective meaning" (105) arises from speech, communication. Speech allows us to get a grip on thought, though it always lags behind (89). For Patočka, as for Merleau-Ponty, speech is not an instrument but "resembles more our natural bodily organs" and is available to us "in the same way as bodily skills" (90).

Speech is grounded in our experience of the other's body -- whether person or animal -- as an "expressive phenomenon." However, expressive gestures are not yet language, which presupposes freedom or "choice" -- the awareness of a distinction between oneself "as a subject" and one's "tendencies" -- which yields "original clarity concerning the whole of being." The child's phonetic "play" becomes language (a "system of objective signs") when, "in a flash," she grasps that "everything has a name." This flash is "thinking," a "development of spontaneity" which no "earlier form of experience can explain." Judgment is originally "naming judgment" and results in an "ideal power" over things (95-98).

Language thus presupposes thought. A kind of typification tied to life-functions already belongs to sensibility, but Patočka argues that perceptual "constancies," genuine objectifications, require "the free personal standpoint" (103). He rejects Wittgenstein's attempt to bypass subjectivity through a picture theory, embracing instead a version of Leibniz's idea that "language is a 'mirror of reason'" (107). But because language is nevertheless a function of life -- the "specifically human tendency toward life in truth" -- it presupposes the "immense, continually creative and infinitely rich world process," the "true ineffabile of life which cannot be bound by any analytic law" (111).

Chapter 5 draws some conclusions from Patočka's phenomenological analyses. Science is a higher-order constitutive achievement that presupposes the "naïve world." While science can strive to eliminate "anthropomorphism," an "overall understanding of being" will remain "relative to our vital necessities and endeavors" as these are grasped in transcendental reflection (113). "Metaphysics" just is phenomenological "theory of constitution," and a philosophically satisfying unification of science and philosophy will arise only if the two work together on the task of "interpreting all existence from the inner sources of life itself" (114).

From the standpoint of the phenomenological epoché, one might wonder whether Patočka is entitled to his neo-naturalistic appeal to "life" and to "organic tendencies" underlying constitutive achievements. Are these really grounded in the evidence of reflection, or do they represent borrowings from common-sense and science, ontological "posits" that themselves need to be subjected to constitutive phenomenological analysis?[2]

Whatever the answer may be, Patočka's 1970 Supplement doubles down on the idea that phenomenological constitution is a function of "life." The text consists of three sections. The first elaborates the basic shift from Patočka's earlier position: phenomenological reflection is not the province of a "pre-existent" transcendental subjectivity who "posits" the world (Husserl); rather, it is the defining feature of a subject for whom, concerned for its own being, the world is continually "at issue" (Heidegger). The second section canvasses the history of the world-problem from Descartes to Heidegger and exhibits Patočka's growing appreciation for the ideology-critical potential of dialectic (126). The final section outlines Patočka's "cosmic solution" (145) to the world-problem via the "three movements of human life." Following the "unrepentantly speculative bent" (158) of Fink, Patočka argues that "the ontology of life can be broadened into an ontology of the world if we understand life as movement in the original sense of the word" (161), a sense Patočka retrieves from Aristotle. Here phenomenology bottoms out in neo-naturalism, together with a metaphysics of redemption which involves an eschatology quite different from Husserl's belief that "the world is an unconscious reason searching for itself," helped along by the philosopher's life of scientific responsibility (190).[3]

Patočka derives his idea of the three movements of human life from Heidegger's analysis of the three "ek-stases" of Dasein's temporality, but this derivation involves a significant revision. Patočka embraces the ontology of Dasein: subjectivity is anxious praxis for the sake of possibilities of one's being; its fundamental mode is not science but "struggle" (190) -- above all, the struggle against self-deception (inauthenticity) fostered by submission to "ideological fallacies" (174). Nevertheless, Heidegger's ontology remains "excessively formal" thanks to its neglect of the "primary existential status of corporeality" and so "the dimension of life" (153). Aristotle offers a way to overcome this formality by translating Dasein's temporal ek-stases back into the movement of "life" or nature. As life, Dasein exhibits a movement of "anchoring" in nature, an "acceptance" reflected in our bodily being. This goes along with a second movement, "self-extension," life as praxis that acts for the sake of some possibility of being a self and so discloses a social and historical world. However, this movement is inherently ideological (das Man), and a truly human life, authenticity, requires a third movement, "breakthrough," where the finite self "surrenders" its self-absorption and "lives in order for things . . . to show themselves as they are," "devotion" as "a cosmocentric and luminocentric life" (165-178).[4]

Patočka sees his phenomenology of the life-world as a radicalization of the epoché. If phenomenology is the study of the "phenomenon as such" (182), then the epoché cannot stop with the bracketing of posited beings; the subject, as supposed noetic ground of the world, must be bracketed. Such a phenomenology is "a-subjective," not because there are appearings without anyone to whom they appear, but because the subject belongs to the cosmic process of nature in which it must recover itself.[5] This is not "a purely noematic phenomenology" (182), however, since in being an issue for itself the self's struggle renders the "phenomenon as such" meaningful (116-17).

The book follows Patočka's path from transcendental phenomenology to a phenomenological metaphysics of nature. How convincing one finds such naturalism will depend largely on one's view of phenomenological method. The present volume is especially valuable because, through particular phenomenological analyses of central matters, it makes evident what speaks for and against Patočka's own speculative turn. Such analyses retain whatever legitimacy they have quite independently of such a turn. Indeed, one of the most valuable lessons to be learned from Patočka's practice is that phenomenology is not a fixed system but a collaborative effort. As he himself notes, "the phenomena discerned by Husserl remain," even after the Heideggerian revision of the concept of reflection: "phenomena are phenomena" (184). The philosophical imperative is to do justice to them.

[1] Representative instances of this trend include Laszlo Tengelyi, Welt und Unendlichkeit (Alber, 2014); Renaud Barbaras, Introduction à une phénoménologie de la vie (Vrin, 2008); Claude Romano, L'événement et le monde (Presses Universitaires de France, 1998); Günter Figal, Gegenständlichkeit (Mohr Siebeck, 2006); and Evan Thompson, Mind in Life (Harvard University Press, 2007).

[2] For a general elaboration of these questions, see Steven Crowell, "Transcendental Life," in Phenomenology and the Transcendental (pp. 21-48), ed. S. Heinämaa, M. Hartimo, and T. Miettinen (Routledge, 2014). Regarding Patočka's position specifically, see Crowell, "'Idealities of Nature': Jan Patočka on Reflection and the Three Movements of Human Life," in Jan Patočka and the Heritage of Phenomenology (pp. 7-22), ed. I. Chvatík and E. Abrams (Springer, 2010).

[3] See the discussion of this latter issue in Jacque Derrida, The Gift of Death, tr. D. Wills (University of Chicago Press, 1995).

[4] A more worked-out account of these three movements can be found in Jan Patočka, Body, Community, Language, World, tr. E. Kohák, ed. J. Dodd (Open Court, 1998).

[5] At the 2016 SPEP meeting, a talk by Bob Sandmeyer ("Jan Patočka's Conception of an 'Asubjective Phenomenology'") helped me to appreciate this point.