The Nature and Future of Philosophy

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Michael Dummett, The Nature and Future of Philosophy, Columbia University Press, 2010, 152pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780231150538.

Reviewed by Han-Johann Glock, University of Zurich


Sir Michael Dummett, who died on 27 December 2011, was one of the most important analytic philosophers of the last 60 years. Indeed, he was one of the last great heroes of that movement. Although analytic philosophy is triumphing institutionally around the globe, its development has stagnated; and the last 20 years have not witnessed the rise of new luminaries of the same stature as Dummett, Davidson, Hempel, Strawson, Lewis, von Wright, Rawls, Hare and Hart, to say nothing of giants like Moore, Russell, Wittgenstein and Quine.

It is entirely fitting, therefore, that Dummett's last book to appear in his lifetime is not just a reflection on the aims, methods and prospects of philosophy in general, but also a thoughtful defence of analytic philosophy, one which culminates in a plea for overcoming the chasms between analytic and so-called "continental philosophy". The book also addresses a wider audience than Dummett's previous philosophical writings, and it is written in a much more accessible and occasionally colloquial prose. Finally, in contrast to most of Dummett's writings, it abounds with examples, many of them illuminating.

The Nature and Future of Philosophy is not, strictly speaking, Dummett's last book. For it appeared in an Italian translation in 2001. Unfortunately, this information is tucked away on the copyright page. The text would also have benefited from an index, and from the inclusion of references concerning the passages cited. In general, the editing of the book cries out for severe censure. There are countless typos and other linguistic infelicities, many of them so severe as to distort or reverse the sense (see, e.g., vi, 3, 22, 43, 61, 62, 69, 85, 111, 115, 119, 127, 138). There are also factual errors that even a perfunctory copy-editing should have picked up, e.g., the confusion of Protestant and Orthodox Christianity on p. 53. It is to be hoped that Columbia University Press will rectify these grave shortcomings in future imprints.

For one other drawback of the book, Dummett himself bears responsibility. There is no Preface or Introduction explaining the aim and structure. The first seven chapters, together with the last, fall squarely under the book's title. They contain Dummett's strictly meta-philosophical reflections. Chapters 1-7 present a conception of philosophy that may come as a slight surprise to assiduous readers of Dummett's previous writings. For one thing, he situates philosophy as a distinctive intellectual activity in a wider context, contrasting it with both science and religion. His reflections on the latter (chs. 6-7) are of interest mainly for one reason: Dummett was a devout Roman Catholic, and this may have had an impact not just on his admirable contribution to the struggle against racism but also, though less obviously, on some of his strictly speaking philosophical views, e.g., his defence of anti-realism and of the conceivability of backward causation. And yet, at least to my knowledge, these chapters constitute the only sustained discussion of the philosophy of religion that he ever published. Their general message, however, is neither very controversial nor very original. Dummett rightly criticizes the fideist view that religious creeds reduce to ritual practices that participants engage in without accepting bona fide statements, notably to the effect that God(s) exist(s). He also, with even greater justice, insists that in both the theoretical and the practical domain proper philosophy must follow the argument wherever it leads rather than lapsing into religious apologetics.

The second novelty concerns Dummett's presentation of the aims and methods of philosophy. Some central tenets remain in place.

  1. The basic task of philosophy is the analysis of the structure of thought.
  2. The structure of thought must be distinguished from the structure of thinking.
  3. The only proper way of analysing the structure of thought consists in analysing the structure of the linguistic expression of thought.
  4. Consequently, the philosophy of language is the foundation of philosophy.

As before, Dummett derives this linguistic turn from Frege (e.g., 115-6), even though the latter never propounded (III) or (IV). Worse still, Frege explicitly rejected (II). Admittedly, he showed considerable interest in natural languages and occasionally relied on ordinary grammar in constructing his formal system. He also regarded language as the only mirror of thought we have. But he combined this with the idea that it is a distorting mirror. Moreover, thought has "priority" over language, which is why the concept-script departs from ordinary language in order to mirror the structure of thought more faithfully.

Be that as it may, what is novel is that Dummett now gives a rationale for (I). And that rationale is more Wittgensteinian than Fregean. Philosophy needs to analyse thoughts and concepts because its characteristic and peculiar problems are rooted not in lack of knowledge about reality, but in conceptual "misunderstandings and confusions" (21). "Thus the philosopher's only resource is the analysis of concepts we already possess, but about which we are confused; he seeks to remove that confusion" (11). Philosophy strives to explicate the "grammar of thought" (ch. 3). Although it may be said to be "concerned with reality", this concern is indirect: it does not "discover new facts about [reality]: it seeks to improve our understanding of what we already know". "It concerns our view of reality by seeking to clarify the concepts in terms of which we conceive of it" (10-1). Unfortunately, Dummett does not address an obvious challenge to this position: an elucidation of our concepts will illuminate the categories of reality only if there is an isomorphism between our conceptual scheme and the fundamental categories of reality, either because the former reflects the latter, as Russell and the early Wittgenstein contend, or because the alleged essences in reality are nothing but metaphysical projections of the distinctions we draw in thought and language, as Kant and the later Wittgenstein would have it.

By contrast to Wittgenstein, Dummett insists that philosophy's task of resolving conceptual puzzles and confusions does not preclude it from discovering "true propositions" that "embody the results of philosophical clarification". On this issue he sides with Frege, who regarded philosophy as a "sector in the systematic quest for truth", though not one that forms part of the natural sciences (4, 13). Even by Wittgensteinian lights, Dummett is right in the following sense. The results of philosophical clarifications explicate the concepts which give rise to philosophical puzzles, concepts with which we operate either in common parlance or in a specialized form of discourse. And such conceptual explications can be correct or incorrect, accurate or inaccurate, depending on the conceptual apparatus we actually employ. But Dummett also insists that the conceptual truths that result from successful explications are not propositions about what it makes sense to say, about the "grammar of linguistic expressions in even the broadest sense", pace Wittgenstein. This is puzzling. His version of the linguistic turn commits Dummett to the idea that conceptual truths cannot be separated from truths about the role or meaning of the signs through which we express our concepts. And these truths concern not facts about the world -- what is or is not the case -- but rather what it does or does not make sense to say. Small wonder, then, that Dummett himself approvingly quotes Wittgenstein's rejection of de re metaphysical essences: "Essence is expressed by grammar" (150).

In any event, Dummett sides with Wittgenstein against Quine in drawing a sharp line between philosophy on the one hand and natural science on the other. Indeed, in a very Wittgensteinian spirit he regards "scientism" -- the tendency "to regard the natural sciences as the only true channel of knowledge" (35) -- as the greatest threat to philosophical progress today. And it is with respect to this threat that he anticipates a break-up of the analytic movement, namely into naturalists on the one hand, more traditional conceptual analysts on the other. But this threat also holds out an intriguing prospect, according to Dummett, namely for a rapprochement of the latter, non-naturalist stream of analytic philosophy with continental philosophy, since both converge on the idea of philosophy as a reflection on human thought and speech (149-50).

In a chapter devoted to Gadamer's philosophy of language (ch. 11), Dummett also dwells on what he regards as a crucial difference between the continental and the analytic interest in language. Only analytic philosophy took a linguistic turn (88), since it alone is interested in the notion of meaning, the logical structure of sentences and the "operation of linguistic understanding" (91). Yet he himself partly undermines this case by noting (and deploring) striking convergences between Gadamer and Davidson. Both pass by the notion of meaning in favour of understanding; both maintain that all linguistic understanding is interpretation; and both insist that linguistic understanding must be placed in a wider context of understanding human practice. The first and even the third point are not just shared by Wittgenstein, they are also in line with the spirit of Dummett's own approach (e.g., 121-2). It is not a linguistic turn per se that sets analytic philosophy apart from hermeneutics, in particular, but the quest for a logical analysis of the hidden structure of our language. Even that quest was never shared by "ideal language philosophers", who preferred to construct artificial languages. And it was abandoned by the later Wittgenstein and Oxford conceptual analysts.

The remaining chapters contain familiar material on Frege and anti-realism (chs. 8-10, 15), as well as interesting new discussions of the paradox of analysis and relativism (chs. 12 and 16 -- misnumbered as 15). Yet I would like to end with a discussion of a topic that Dummett has broached before, namely the relation between thought and language (ch. 14). That chapter features an uncharacteristic howler. Dummett explains the fact that Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations (read: Philosophische Untersuchungen) can be translated from German into other languages by reference to the fact that "Wittgenstein, like Frege, is interested in the senses of the sentences he discusses" (117). Surely, whether Wittgenstein's sentences can be translated does not depend on whether they are about senses, but whether they have senses which are shared by sentences of other languages.

The chapter also combines two topics in a fashion that is worth pursuing, namely a justification of the idea that thought must be analysed via its linguistic expression -- statement (III) above -- and a discussion of the possibility of thought in creatures without language, i.e., non-human animals. Dummett challenges a project that he rightly associates with recent analytic philosophers like Evans and Peacocke, namely of replacing the analysis of sentences and words in a theory of meaning through an allegedly more basic "philosophy of thought" which analyses thoughts and concepts at a non- or pre-linguistic level.

For the sake of argument Dummett grants that grasp of a perceptual concept like circularity might be manifested in "differential behaviour" of a non-linguistic kind. Yet he denies that "the appeal to a presumed prior grasp of the thoughts and concepts" expressible in such behaviour affords any advantage over a systematic theory of meaning for a natural language. For one thing, it merely transfers the challenge from explaining an understanding of words to explaining the "languageless grasp of concepts". For another, the difference between a "knowledge of meaning" and a "languageless grasp of concepts" has nothing to do with that between linguistic and non-linguistic creatures; it merely concerns "different criteria for grasping a word and for grasping the concept it expresses", namely knowledge of meaning (or definitions) on the one hand, discriminatory behaviour on the other (122-4).

Dummett hints at an important point. Roughly speaking, there are two kinds of criteria for understanding a general term, the ability to explain it on the one hand, the ability to apply it in classifications on the other. But he ignores the fact that this second ability is more basic in that it has a direct analogue in behaviour of a simpler, non-linguistic kind. And while the philosophers of thought would have to accept that the switch from language to thought only pushes the problem of understanding one step back, they could insist that it is a step towards a more basic level. Although the ability to apply general terms does not reduce to the ability to classify things perceptually, it certainly presupposes that ability.

The crux of the matter lies in Dummett's criticism of the idea that animals could possess thoughts and concepts in the first place. He alludes to a well-known example of Frege's. Even if a dog reacts differently to being attacked by two dogs than to being attacked by one dog, we would have no grounds for crediting him with a thought like "There is just one dog barring my path" or with even concepts of small numbers. For that would presuppose that the dog "apprehend what is in common between being opposed by just one dog, burying just one bone, finding just one person in the house, and so on. . . . So the dog does not have the very thought by which we express the feature of the situation that he has recognized" (118).

Dummett is right to insist that reacting differently to one and two opponents does not suffice for the attribution of a grasp of the difference between one and two. But he is jumping to a conclusion in maintaining that "no canine behaviour is conceivable that would warrant the attribution". A non-linguistic creature can in principle display an apprehension of the general difference, namely by mastering match-to-sample tasks. And some great apes have in fact achieved a certain proficiency in this respect (see M. Tomasello and J. Call, Primate Cognition, Oxford University Press 1997, ch. 5).

Dummett denies that animals can have the same thoughts as we do, and indeed any bona fide thoughts at all, since the latter presuppose concepts. At the same time he grants that they can have "proto-thoughts", which it is impossible to capture in words (119). This distinction between different types of content leads to a congruity problem. It suggests that a statement of the form "Both Sarah and the dog believe that p" is not so much a falsehood as a syllepsis like "Both the exam and the chair were hard". For "Sarah believes that p" comes out as "Sarah stands in the relation of believing to the thought that p" while "The dog believes that p" comes out as "The dog stands in the relation of believing to the protothought that p". Unlike a syllepsis, however, the original statement gives rise to perfectly legitimate inferences and explanations. Thus we can use it to explain a common reaction between Sarah and the dog. If both Sarah and the dog suddenly notice that there is a precipice in front of them, for instance, this explains why both stop dead in their tracks.

There is a difference between Sarah’s believing that p and the dog’s believing that p. But it does not consist in their being related to different types of "content". Instead, believing that p amounts to something different in the case of the dog. An attribution of such a belief to a non-linguistic subject lacks many of the conceptual connections which such an attribution possesses in the linguistic case. This is one more case in which the analysis of thought requires reference to a wider context, in this instance to the overall abilities of the subject. Taking such wider contexts into account may not conform perfectly to the letter of Dummett's book, but it is in line with its spirit.