The Nature and Value of Knowledge: Three Investigations

Placeholder book cover

Duncan Pritchard, Alan Millar, and Adrian Haddock, The Nature and Value of Knowledge: Three Investigations, Oxford University Press, 2010, 274pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199586264.

Reviewed by Stephen R. Grimm, Fordham University


Although this is a co-authored book, the result of extensive collaboration by three former colleagues at the University of Stirling, it is not co-authored in the usual sense. In the usual sense, to say that a book is co-authored is to say that the authors have worked together to produce a single text, the product of a kind of consensus. This book is a quite different sort of collaboration, one that combines three distinct mini-monographs (each is between 70 and 100 pages) by three excellent philosophers. Rather than resulting in a consensus, each instead offers his own slant on what knowledge is and why (if at all) it is valuable.

Not only do the authors not agree, but some of the best moments in the book occur when they explicitly criticize one another. Thus Adrian Haddock takes issue with Duncan Pritchard for accepting the post-Gettier “mythology” that knowledge is something more than justified true belief, and Alan Millar raises important objections against Pritchard’s account of abilities. Pritchard too, though not openly critical of his co-authors, clearly has them in mind when he pauses more than once to ask whether his account of knowledge is properly thought of as reductionist — an important question, given his co-authors’ concerns about such views.

All told, this book therefore offers a superb, well-rounded view of some of the latest thinking on the nature and value of knowledge. In this review I will briefly summarize the contributions in the order they appear and note some concerns about each.

I. Pritchard’s Knowledge and Understanding

Pritchard’s contribution is notable in two main ways. First, he sets out, more clearly than anyone has done so far, exactly what is at issue in recent debates concerning the value of knowledge. Second, he offers an important argument for his own revisionist approach to these debates, on which (contrary to common thought) it is not knowledge that is distinctively valuable from an epistemic point of view, but rather understanding, which he takes to be an epistemic good distinct from knowledge.

The main question with respect to the “distinctive” value of knowledge has to do with why it is that we are so interested in knowledge as opposed to states which fall short of knowledge. For instance, if truth is the main thing we want, from an epistemic point of view, then it is unclear why a true belief that amounts to knowledge should be more valuable than a true belief that is missing something required for knowledge — either because, let’s suppose, the true belief is unjustified or it is justified but falls short because one finds oneself in a Gettier case.

After clarifying these issues in his first chapter, Pritchard goes on to argue that the best case — indeed, he claims, the “only” principled case (pp. 25, 45) — for the distinctive value of knowledge has been made by philosophers such as Ernest Sosa, John Greco, and Linda Zagzebski, a group that Pritchard collectively refers to as “robust virtue epistemologists.” Because robust virtue epistemologists hold that a true belief amounts to knowledge just in case the truth of the belief is in some sense “because of” the cognitive virtues of the person forming the belief, Pritchard claims the view plausibly explains why knowledge should be distinctively valuable to us: viz., when we arrive at the truth because of our own abilities (rather than luck, or happenstance, or something else), and hence come to know, this coming to know constitutes a kind of achievement or a success for which we deserve primary credit. And it is because knowledge constitutes a cognitive achievement that we hold it in such special regard; cognitive achievements, after all, seem to be the kind of things that we desire for their own sake or in virtue of their role in constituting a good human life.

But while Pritchard thinks that robust virtue epistemology comes closest to establishing the distinctive value of knowledge, he also thinks it falls short. Focusing especially on the work of Greco, Pritchard claims that there are many cases of knowledge that do not, intuitively, amount to achievements on the part of the knower. (Here he borrows heavily from the work of Jennifer Lackey.) Suppose you are a visitor to Chicago and want to know where the Sears Tower is located. You ask a native and then form a correct belief based on his say-so. Even though you will now know where the Tower is located, it seems odd to say that your success is primarily due to your own abilities, in the way that Greco’s account seems to require. Instead, the success seems almost wholly creditable to the abilities of the native who gave you the information (his good memory, first-hand experience, etc.).

Pritchard then concludes, too quickly I think, that because Greco’s account of the distinctive value of knowledge is flawed, we should rethink our initial idea that knowledge is, in fact, distinctively valuable. (Too quickly, among other reasons, because Sosa’s account of what it means for a true belief to be “because of” an agent’s ability is not as demanding as Greco’s and thus does not have the same difficulty with cases of testimonial knowledge — despite Pritchard’s brief attempt in a footnote, on pp. 43-44, to argue otherwise.) According to his alternative diagnosis, what the initial thought was really committed to was the distinctive value of cognitive achievements, and we were confused about the value of knowledge because we tended to focus, misleadingly, on those instances of knowledge which amounted to cognitive achievements, overlooking those which did not.

In his final chapter Pritchard then offers his revisionist theory: given that we are mainly interested in cognitive achievements we should take a cue from Jonathan Kvanvig and turn our attention away from knowledge and towards the cognitive good of understanding instead. For one thing, Pritchard claims, all cases of understanding are by their nature cognitive achievements, so it is no surprise that they should be distinctively valuable to us, and in a way that knowledge is not. For another, there seems to be good reason to think that understanding is not just a kind or species of knowledge (as several philosophers of science have argued, as well as a few epistemologists), because while there can be cases of “lucky” understanding there cannot be cases of lucky knowledge.

I will now turn to a few criticisms of Pritchard’s piece, mostly concerning his revisionist view about the value of knowledge and epistemic value more generally.

First, even if Pritchard is right that what we really value from an epistemic point of view is cognitive achievement, it would be a mistake to suppose that our primary focus in epistemology should now turn to understanding, with knowledge becoming something of a second citizen. Instead, if Pritchard is right it looks like our focus should now be on cognitive achievements wherever they are found — not just on cases of understanding (assuming Pritchard is right that all instances of understanding are instances of achievements) but also on those (plentiful) cases of knowledge which do amount to cognitive achievements, to say nothing of all of those other epistemic goods which are plausibly thought of as cognitive achievements — e.g., the good of “fitting” one’s belief to one’s evidence, or of correctly sensing defeating evidence for one’s belief, and so on. Indeed, one odd result of Pritchard’s revisionist picture is that it seems like one of the few cognitive goods that would come to be seen as undeserving (less deserving?) of theoretical attention, because less than a cognitive achievement, would be knowledge gained via testimony. This seems like an odd picture of the sort of epistemic goods worth theorizing about, however — one that includes almost all of the traditional goods that epistemologists have theorized about but which carves testimonial knowledge off the map.

The role of testimony also points to another shortcoming of Pritchard’s account, because it seems that the very same sorts of considerations that led Pritchard to believe that there could be cases of knowledge without achievement also suggest there can be cases of understanding without achievement. Suppose, to appeal to one of Pritchard’s examples, I come home to find my house in cinders. Distraught, I ask the fire chief on the scene why it burned down, and he tells me it burned down because of faulty wiring. According to Pritchard (and common sense), I can now understand why my house burned down, but if we pause to ask who deserves the primary credit for the fact that I now understand why my house burned down, surely it seems right to say that the primary credit belongs to the fire chief. More exactly, it surely seems right that the main reason why I arrived at the truth with respect to the cause of the fire has almost everything to do with the chief’s abilities (his patient sifting through the ashes, his years of experience with fire scenes) and very little to do with my own.

Of course, I had to do some mental work on my own — “grasping” is an essentially first-person activity, after all. But what is at issue here is not who deserves primary credit for the grasping but rather who deserves primary credit for the fact that what was grasped was the correct causal story rather than a pretender. Had the chief told me that the fire occurred because of a stray cigarette, for example, I would have “grasped” this causal story just as readily.

If this is right, then value-wise, understanding and knowledge would seem to be “formally” almost identical — that is, while the testimonial cases, or more generally the cases where the primary credit for the success belongs to something outside of our agency, would not amount to achievements, virtually all of the rest would.

Perhaps Pritchard could reply, finally, that the mental act of piecing together the fire chief’s story — of making sense of it — is the real cognitive achievement. But if this is right, then cognitive achievements begin exploding all over the place. In this weak, more subjective sense of “making sense of things,” surely conspiracy theorists of every stripe, fundamentalists, and so on, should count as making sense of things, and hence of realizing a cognitive achievement. This is not necessarily a criticism of Pritchard’s view, because epistemologists have in fact long been interested in giving an account of what this “making sense of” amounts to. But it does help to show that the class of cognitive achievements (even on the “strong” sense of achievement that Pritchard distinguishes, p. 70) is much larger than Pritchard seems to appreciate.

II. Millar’s Knowledge and Recognition

Millar’s main goal in his elegantly written contribution is to try to resolve what he calls “the central tension” in contemporary epistemology: viz., the tension between (a) the “traditional” claim that knowledge admits of reductive conceptual analysis and (b) the roles that knowledge and thinking about knowing seem to play in our lives.

Why are these in tension? Because, Millar suggests, when we look at many of the leading reductive accounts, what we find are analyses that are so elaborate that it is implausible to think that the elements of the analysis play a significant role in our ordinary judgments about knowledge. Consider, for example, Alvin Goldman’s analysis in his classic 1976 paper “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge,” in which items like perceptual equivalents and DOE relations (or Distance-Orientation-Environment relations) play an important part. According to Millar, since ordinary people do not seem to appeal to such things when they are making their judgments about knowledge, either explicitly or implicitly, it is a mistake to think that such a reduction captures our ordinary concept of knowledge. And the same goes, he suggests, for any of the increasingly technical analyses that have been produced over the last fifty years or so.

What’s more, when we consider the factors that people do seem to have in mind when they make their judgments about knowledge, these factors cannot, it seems, be understood in a reductive way. To take one of Millar’s examples, suppose we are evaluating whether a friend of ours knows that his dog is running back to him from the bushes (pp. 107-108). What we are mainly doing in such a situation, Millar suggests, is evaluating whether our friend has an ability to tell, in these circumstances, that this is his dog. But if Millar is right, and “a way of telling is just a way of coming to know” (p. 104), then in judging whether others have the ability to tell something we are already implicating the concept of knowledge. Put another way, on Millar’s view we cannot make good sense of the notion of “being able to tell how things stand” without already implicitly appealing to the concept of knowledge.

Millar goes on to make a number of valuable points about the way in which the concept of knowledge figures into our everyday practices (his discussion of knowledge and the norms of assertion is particularly worth reading), but here I will simply register some doubts about his arguments against reductive accounts of knowledge.

For one thing, to use Goldman’s DOE analysis as your prime example of a reductive account does not seem especially fair. Even if that analysis (let’s suppose) involves technical concepts that do not figure in our ordinary judgments, what about simpler, less ornate analyses? Consider, for example, a less ornate analysis likewise inspired by Goldman: namely, a straightforward reliabilist account (shorn of the DOE machinery) on which someone’s belief amounts to knowledge just in case it derives from a reliable source. Surely ordinary people have the concept of reliability and could plausibly draw on this concept as they evaluate whether someone knows.

When it comes to reliabilist analyses, however, the main thing that Millar says against them, in a few sentences, is that they are subject to “familiar problems” (p. 113) — in particular, he suggests, they are subject to the generality problem. But rather than rehearse standard reliabilist replies to the generality problem, it might be more productive to point out that Millar’s own account of knowledge itself seems best understood not just along reductive lines, but along reliabilist lines in particular.

Consider, first, that if we are thinking of knowing in terms of having an ability, there is no need to think of these abilities as abilities to know (thus rendering the account circular or non-reductive). Instead, it seems just as natural — indeed, I would say, more natural — to think of these abilities as abilities to reliably track the truth with respect to some question. For concreteness, suppose we think of this truth-tracking in terms of the safety analysis originally proposed by Sosa and discussed by Pritchard in his section of the book. On this view, a belief counts as safe just in case the belief would not easily have been false; put differently, it counts as safe just in case in all the nearby worlds where one forms a belief with respect to some subject, one’s belief on the subject is true. (Pritchard, it should be noted, raises concerns about a safety condition, but suppose for the sake of argument that these concerns can be addressed, as I think they can.)

I take it that such a view would count as a reductive analysis of knowledge, because knowledge is now being understood in non-knowledge involving terms (essentially, just appealing to the notion of believing the truth across nearby worlds). For our purposes, however, the important point is that when Millar himself offers a diagnosis about why one person or another knows (or fails to know) in a given case, he himself leans almost entirely on safety considerations. Thus, on Millar’s view, the reason why you do not know that your colleague is currently in the office based on your knowledge that she is usually around at this time is because “routines can too easily be disrupted” (p. 121). Or again, the reason why you do not know there are sheep nearby from the sound of their bleeting, when you are in an environment in which the same bleeting noise could as easily have been made by goats as by sheep is because “all too easily could something produce that sound and not be a sheep” (p. 181). Or again, and filling in a bit more of the story, that the reason why you know that the cooking hob has been turned off in a case where one has just checked, but not in a case where one is merely relying on one’s memory that “by and large one switches it off automatically when one has stopped using the hob” (p. 100), is because in the latter case, but not the former, too easily might one have made a mistake.

I should note that Millar does offer other reasons against a reductive account and, in particular, against an account that would attempt (as I have just done) to understand abilities to know in terms of abilities to get at the truth across close possible worlds. For example, Millar persuasively argues that the desire for the truth that inspires many of our inquiries is really a desire for knowledge, because what we want is not the truth in any old way, but rather the truth securely possessed — in other words, what we want is knowledge. But even if this is a correct account of what we want from our inquiries (and I think it is), it does not establish that knowledge must be understood non-reductively, because again, and even on Millar’s own telling, we can think of the knowing state as one in which one’s possession of the truth is secure or modally robust. That is, one can think of the knowing state in terms that do not seem to appeal to knowledge at all.

III. Haddock’s Knowledge and Action

Haddock’s contribution is a more difficult read than the others. For one thing, Haddock questions so many orthodoxies in epistemology that it is difficult to place his view relative to other accounts or to figure out what exactly his position amounts to (e.g., he insists, as noted above, that it is a myth to suppose that knowledge is anything over and above justified true belief). For another, the primary authors he finds affinities with — John McDowell and Elizabeth Anscombe — are themselves very difficult authors to understand, so engaging with these figures does not make things any easier on the reader. Still, overall I think Haddock has identified an original and viable account of our visual knowledge of the world, one that is admirably creative and worth serious thought.

Haddock’s basic idea, as I understand it, is that when we visually know something about the world — say, that there is a lemon on the table — the fact which justifies our knowledge is our seeing of the lemon. That is, it is not as if the fact which justifies us is some bare property of our visual experience (that it looks to us as if there is a lemon on the table, perhaps) from which we then go on to infer the existence of the lemon. Rather, the justifier is the seeing itself.

In addition, according to Haddock one cannot have this sort of first-order visual knowledge about the lemon without also having second-order knowledge concerning the fact which justifies the first-order knowledge (p. 199). Or, as he sometimes puts it, one’s belief that there is a lemon on the table cannot amount to knowledge unless one is “able” to cite the thing that justifies one’s belief that there is a lemon on the table — in the good case, the fact that one sees the lemon. As these last two sentences suggest, it is not entirely clear on Haddock’s view whether the second-order knowledge need always be present for there to be first-order knowledge, or whether instead one simply needs to be able to call up such knowledge (if one’s belief is challenged, say). Nonetheless it is clear that Haddock thinks some sort of second-order requirement is needed for our knowledge to be genuinely human, rational knowledge.

(For those who might worry that this second-order requirement over-intellectualizes what it takes to know and leaves creatures like cats and dogs out of luck when it comes to knowledge, Haddock replies that knowledge is a diverse lot, and the sort of knowledge he is interested in is of the properly “rational” sort. If cats and dogs have knowledge, he suggests, they do not have it in the way that rational beings do — although cats and dogs might not be happy about being called “non-rational” [p. 196].)

As Haddock notes, troubles arise for his view on a number of counts — for example, if knowledge always requires that one be able to cite one’s justifiers, then it looks like a regress is right around the corner. Although Haddock creatively grapples with many of these concerns, one case that helps to bring out some of the special difficulties of his view is modeled on fake barn examples and goes as follows.

Suppose that you unhappily find yourself in “fake-fruit country” (or maybe just a Pottery Barn) where tables are stocked with bowls of fancy soaps carved to look like real fruit and where your eyes happen to land on the sole real lemon in a particular bowl. You then come to believe, accurately, that there is a lemon in the bowl. Cases of this sort help to show, on the first-order level, how Haddock’s account is not as radical as he would have us believe and, on the second-order level, how it seems much too radical.

As an account of first-order knowledge, it does not seem particularly radical, because in response to this sort of fake-fruit scenario Haddock insists, along with most contemporary epistemologists, that for the belief to amount to knowledge it is not enough for one to simply see the lemon, in what we might call a weak sense of “see” — that is, for one to be able to accurately identify the lemon on sight. In addition, it must be the case not just that one is not being Gettiered, so that one’s belief is not “only accidentally true” (p. 200) and also, apparently, that one not have any internal defeaters for the belief, so that it is responsibly held (p. 201). But then it looks like what it takes for a belief to amount to knowledge — at least, at the first-order level — is not terribly different for someone like Haddock and, say, his co-author Pritchard, even though he criticizes Pritchard for unreflectively “living by” the Gettier myth (p. 197).

Where Haddock and more mainstream epistemologists would differ, presumably, is that Haddock would insist that in fake-fruit country, the belief that the lemon is in the bowl would not count as justified, because he crams the anti-Gettier condition into the justification condition (p. 200), whereas Pritchard would presumably say that the lemon belief is justified, and thus that some additional anti-Gettier condition needs to be satisfied in addition to the justification condition. Who is right about this? As an account of first-order knowledge, I would say this question about whether the anti-Gettier condition belongs in the “justification” condition or not is beside the point; presumably it is not the words that matter. As an account of the ordinary way (if there is an ordinary way) we use the word “justified,” however, surely most of us would say that someone’s innocent belief about the lemon, in fake-fruit country, certainly is justified. Poor guy, those hooligans at Pottery Barn just conspired against him.

On the second-order level, moreover, cases of this sort help to show that the account is too radical, because it is implausible to suppose that we can tell “by reflection alone” that things like an anti-Gettier condition have been met. Anti-Gettier conditions, after all, typically have to do with facts about our modal situation — with how easily we might have been mistaken, e.g. — and it is hard to see how even the most expansive, disjunctivist view of perceptual experience could be thought to include facts like that.

Haddock does gamely try to argue, along Anscombian lines, that one can know “non-observationally” that one has satisfied these modal requirements, just so long as one believes one has and it is true that one has. But I must confess that I find this view even harder to grasp than Anscombe’s own view, that we can have non-observational knowledge of our intentional actions. It is not so much that I find the Anscombian appeal to non-observational knowledge of worldly facts obviously false as that I find it just very hard to understand.

IV. Final Thought

Overall, this is a significant, rewarding book, one that helps to show the way in which reflecting on the value of knowledge can shed light upon its nature.

In my view, though, one further thing that the contributions help to show is that discussions about epistemic value are still very much in their infancy. For example, even though Pritchard begins his account by assuming that mere true belief is of value to us (p. 11), later on in the book Millar justifiably complains (against Pritchard) that we have been given no reason to accept that true belief has value “merely as such” (p. 167), and Haddock likewise claims that it is wrong to think true beliefs are of value to us, irrespective of their contents (p. 204). But you would think that whether or not true belief (“as such”) has value is an issue of such basic significance to debates about the value of knowledge that until this has been resolved it will be hard to gain significant traction on this issue. Moreover, to say, as Pritchard does, that there is a “specifically epistemic value” that resides in true belief does not particularly clarify things, as far as I can see, because it is not clear what it means to value something in a specifically epistemic way. What this lack of clarity suggests is that basic distinctions philosophers often draw in this literature — between, say, what we value from an epistemic point of view as opposed to what we value from a practical or moral or some other point of view — are far less obvious than they might initially seem.1

1 Thanks to Jason Baehr and Allan Hazlett for helpful feedback on an earlier draft.