The Nature of Consciousness

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Rowlands, Mark, The Nature of Consciousness, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 245pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521808588.

Reviewed by Joseph Levine, Ohio State University


The topic of this book is just what the title states: the nature of consciousness. It can basically be divided into two parts. After the first chapter sets up the problem of phenomenal consciousness, chapters 2-5 tackle questions about supervenience, the explanatory gap, and higher-order theories of consciousness. This part of the book is primarily critical. In chapters 6-10, the author presents his own views about the nature of consciousness, and this is clearly the more original, and I should add, interesting portion of the book.

To my mind the book is quite uneven. While the central idea of the second part is genuinely intriguing, though problematic, the first part, in which the views of others are criticized, is quite disappointing. It would take far too long to support this judgment in detail for each chapter, so I’ll illustrate my point by commenting in some detail on Rowlands’s discussion of David Chalmers’s position. In chapter 2, Rowlands criticizes Chalmers’s argument against physicalism, arguing that Chalmers is guilty of entertaining an incoherent notion of supervenience. Rowlands’s discussion is very difficult to follow, but from what I can tell it is he that is guilty of incoherence, not Chalmers.

Rowlands begins by noting that as Chalmers uses the term “supervenience”, it can support both an ontological reading and an epistemological one. His first criticism is to accuse Chalmers of equivocating in his argument on these two readings. Thus when Chalmers claims that physicalism entails the logical supervenience of the phenomenal facts on the physical facts, this is plausible on the ontological reading. However, when he goes to argue that the phenomenal facts are not logically supervenient on the physical facts, he is clearly working with the epistemological reading. Hence, the argument is guilty of equivocation.

Just on this point about equivocation, while I think there is a real issue here, Chalmers does address it. Many critics of the conceivability argument against physicalism have pointed out the distinction Rowlands is getting at, though they put it in terms of the relation between conceivability and possibility. If a difference in A-facts is inconceivable without a difference in B-facts, then the A-facts are supervenient in the epistemological sense on the B-facts, whereas if it is only that a difference in A-facts is impossible (but not necessarily inconceivable) without a difference in B-facts, then we have supervenience in the ontological sense. The criticism of the conceivability argument, then, is that it only establishes the conceivability of zombie worlds, not their possibility, and it is only the latter that refutes physicalism. Chalmers goes to great lengths in his book, and subsequent papers, to make the case that the conceivability of zombie worlds does establish their possibility. That is what the whole discussion about primary and secondary intensions is for. One may not agree with him about this, but he is not merely equivocating. He argues explicitly for deriving the ontological consequence from the epistemological premise.

As for the alleged incoherence, it’s supposed to be this. Chalmers distinguishes between logical and natural supervenience (where “natural” means the same as “nomological”) by use of the following metaphor: when A-facts logically supervene on B-facts, then when God creates a world with the B-facts settled, the A-facts come along for free, God doesn’t have to do any more to fix them. However, if the A-facts only naturally supervene on the B-facts, then God has to do more, he has to “create bridge principles linking” (p. 30) A-facts and B-facts.

Now here’s where the incoherence allegedly comes in. According to Rowlands, supervenience, whether logical or natural, means that the subvenient facts determine the supervenient facts all by themselves. According to Chalmers, though, something else is necessary, namely the “supervenience relations instantiated in” that world, the bridge principles. After all, he said that God had to create these first in order to get the B-facts, so clearly the B-facts are not determined solely by the A-facts. This, according to Rowlands, is “an excellent illustration of how not to think about the supervenience relation” (page 30).

Well, I think an excellent illustration of how not to think about the supervenience relation is to speak of supervenience relations as instantiated in a world. Supervenience is not a world-bound relation, but a relation between classes of properties that is defined over a class of possible worlds. Logical supervenience is defined over the class of logically possible worlds, and natural supervenience is defined over the class of naturally, or nomologically possible worlds. The relation itself is simply there being no difference in the distribution of the supervenient properties without a difference in the distribution of the subvenient properties within the relevant class of worlds, depending on whether the supervenience is logical or natural. It seems clear that this is how Chalmers intends the distinction, and it fits well with the God metaphor. Assuming that God can only create a logically possible world, if A-facts logically supervene on B-facts, once He’s chosen a world with a specific distribution of B-facts, He will have already determined the specific distribution of A-facts. This follows from the above definition of logical supervenience. However, if the A-facts only naturally supervene on the B-facts, after God has chosen to create a world with a specific distribution of B-facts, He still has a choice of which specific distribution of A-facts to create, since there are possible worlds which share this distribution of B-facts but differ in their A-facts, because their laws differ. Once God chooses the laws, He has picked a class of worlds within which there are no differences in A-facts without differences in B-facts. I see no incoherence here.

Unfortunately, the confusion just described concerning the notion of supervenience is not isolated. Let me illustrate with one more instance. In his discussion of the epistemological reading of supervenience, Rowlands addresses the idea that epistemological supervenience means that a Laplacian Demon (LD) could “read off” the supervenient facts from the basic facts. He then notes that of course one could only do this if one possessed in advance an analysis of the concepts used to represent the supervenient facts in terms of causal roles. The idea is that with this causal-role analysis one could see that the basic facts realized the roles in question and therefore constituted the supervenient facts. All this seems basically right.

However, Rowlands then goes on to ask: but where does LD get this causal role analysis from? He couldn’t infer it from a description of the basic facts alone. But if not, then it turns out we can’t read off the supervenient facts from the basic facts. Hence we don’t have epistemological supervenience. In case one wonders why it’s impossible to derive the causal analyses from the basic facts, Rowlands answers that it’s for the same reason one can’t derive the mental facts from the behavioral facts. That is, just as the “holism of the mental” blocks the derivation of mental facts from behavioral facts, so too the “holism of the physical” will block the derivation of non-basic facts from basic physical facts.

It’s really difficult to figure out what’s going on here. For one thing, it’s no mystery why you can’t read off the causal analyses of concepts of non-basic facts from a description of the basic facts. I mean, how could you? The basic facts are represented in their own vocabulary, and say nothing about concepts. There’s not even the beginning of any reason for thinking you could do this, and of course Chalmers and company recognize this. Their claim, to a first approximation, is that the relevant analyses are . priori. Now, when it comes to “reading off”, or deriving, a description of one set of facts from a description of another set of facts, one assumes that one has access to whatever is known . priori. Of course you must already possess the concepts in terms of which the description of the facts to be read off are expressed, but this doesn’t count as a substantive qualification of the idea of reading off the supervenient facts from the basic ones.

Secondly, the relation of mental facts to behavioral ones is really a totally different question. The standard objections to behaviorism that turn on the fact that mental states cause behavior only in concert with each other are not primarily intended to show that mental concepts must be given holistic analyses. Rather, the point is to show precisely that the mental does not supervene on the behavioral; that the very same set of behavioral facts is consistent with quite different sets of mental facts. However, when it comes to the relation of the mental to the physical, the claim is that supervenience, at least metaphysical supervenience, obtains. Thus the reason you can’t read off the mental from the behavioral is quite different from the reason, if there is one, that you can’t read off the mental from the (basic) physical.

Turning to the second part of the book, the basic idea behind Rowlands’s theory of consciousness is that consciousness has a dual nature – both act and object. Consciousness is always consciousness of something, the object, but it is also, of course, consciousness of something. The directed awareness itself must be kept distinct from the object of awareness. When considering phenomenal character – what it is like to be conscious of something – there are two “interpretations” possible, an “actualist” one and an “objectualist” one. Most current discussions of consciousness work with an objectualist interpretation, but in fact it is the actualist interpretation that properly captures the what-it-is-like of experience.

On the objectualist interpretation, what it is like, say, to see a red rose is to be understood in terms of our awareness of the phenomenal character of the experience. To many this characterization would seem trivial and uncontroversial, but it builds in the idea that phenomenal character is to be found on the “object” side of the act-object duality. Rowlands argues that there is no treatment of phenomenal character that is consistent with both materialism and objectualism. There are three possibilities for how to characterize the object of awareness: either as phenomenal particulars, phenomenal properties, or as representational properties. The first two, he argues, are not consistent with materialism, and the third is inconsistent with objectualism. Another argument against objectualism is that it entails the possibility of a nonsensical possibility, and so leads to incoherence. That is, it entails the possibility that we could be wrong about how an experience seems. Put another way, it entails an appearance-reality distinction for appearances.

On the actualist interpretation, phenomenal character (which is identified with what it is like to have an experience) is a property of the act, the awareness itself of the object of consciousness. So we have the following tripartite structure. There is the object of consciousness, which is usually either an external object or a bodily state (so pain is awareness of a state of bodily damage, say – in this way, like Tye’s position). There is the subject’s awareness of the object. Finally, there is the “mode of presentation”, the way in which the “object is revealed” by the act of conscious awareness.

Take, again, the case of pain. I recently had an ache in my shoulder due to tendonitis of the rotator cuff. My experience of pain can thus be analyzed as follows. I, the subject of the experience, am aware of the inflammation of the tendon in my rotator cuff as painful. The awareness is the act, the inflammation is the object, and the painfulness is the mode of presentation, the way in which the inflammation is “revealed” to me. The phenomenal character, what it is like for me to have this experience of shoulder pain, constitutes my being aware of the inflammation as painful.

The general lines of the actualist interpretation of what it’s like, of phenomenal character, are attractive. It does seem wrong to think of qualia as objects of awareness. The reddish quale I experience when looking at a red object does not seem appropriately described as what it is I’m aware of; rather, what I’m aware of seems to be the red object itself. So saying that I “experience a reddish quale” is misleading, in that it suggests that the experience is of the quale.

There are a number of reasons it seems wrong to treat the quale as an object of experience or awareness. For one thing, and this echoes one of Rowlands’s points, if the quale is the object, then it seems it ought to be possible to get it wrong – to “misperceive” the quale, as it were. Also, if the quale is the object, it ought to be possible for it to exist without being the object of awareness, since the awareness is extrinsic to it. Furthermore, there are the transparency arguments, which do seem compelling. When I focus my attention on what it’s like to see a red tomato, it does seem I’m focusing on the tomato. For all these reasons, treating phenomenal properties as “properties of representing objects under particular modes of presentation” (page 213) rather than as the objects presented, seems to better fit the phenomenon.

But there are problems with this analysis. First, there is the problem of where to locate the “mode of presentation”, the way in which, as Rowlands puts it, the object “is revealed”. When discussing examples, like seeing a red tomato, Rowlands identifies the redness as the mode of presentation (obviously, only one aspect of it). His understanding of the redness is that it is a non-phenomenal property of the tomato. Well, which property? I’m not here worried about the problem of color itself, whether it can be identified with a physical property or a dispositional property. Let’s assume for the moment that for a tomato to be red is for it to instantiate a particular spectral-reflectance profile. My problem is with identifying the mode of presentation associated with phenomenal character with this physical property. Inversion scenarios make it clear that quite different spectral-reflectance profiles are capable of being presented in the same way, phenomenally speaking. The reddishness of the experience is not merely a matter of the directing of conscious awareness on physical red, since there could be reddish experiences that are directed on green. Rowlands thinks he has a response to these inversion arguments, but I find his argument unconvincing.

So we seem to have the following situation. On the one hand, it’s true that consciousness is best thought of as a directing of awareness upon an object, not as the object itself. Yet, on the other hand, certain distinctive properties emerge in the context of this relation, and we need an account of where they come from and in precisely what they inhere.

Another problem with Rowlands’s account is that he seems to think that on his view consciousness does not constitute a problem for materialism. But just as those who took phenomenal properties to be objects of experience have a problem of where to place them in the natural order, so too there is a problem of how to place phenomenal properties in the natural order when they are considered as instantiated by acts of awareness. There are two aspects to the problem. First, how does brain activity amount to a relation of there being something it’s like at all? Second, since the what-it’s-like retains a character distinct from the mode of presentation in Rowlands’s sense – i.e. where it can be identified with a mundane, non-phenomenal property of the object – we still need to find room for what it’s like. So though I think there is much merit to reorienting our analysis of phenomenal consciousness to focus on the relation, the act, rather than the object, I think it probably makes the phenomenon of consciousness even more puzzling, not less.