The Nature of Contingency: Quantum Physics as Modal Realism

The Nature Of Contingency Quantum Physics As Modal Realism

Alastair Wilson, The Nature of Contingency: Quantum Physics as Modal Realism, Oxford University Press, 2020, 219pp., $72.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198846215.

Reviewed by Matteo Morganti, University of Rome ‘Tre’


In a paper published more than forty years ago (Skyrms 1976), Brian Skyrms discussed the hypothesis that many universes exist, the one we inhabit being just a member of a much larger set. Skyrms pointed out that this idea emerged in two rather distinct areas of philosophical research. On the one hand, in metaphysics/modal logic, thanks to the work of David Lewis (see, e.g., Lewis 1973, 1986; for an overview, see Menzel 2021). On the other, in the philosophy of physics, as ‘many-worlds’ interpretation(s) of quantum mechanics were developed based on the insights of Everett (1957) (for a synopsis, see Vaidman 2021). Skyrms concluded his paper on a sceptical note: neither philosophy nor physics, he claimed, gives truly compelling reasons for believing in the existence of a plurality of worlds. Since then, a lot of work has been done on both metaphysical realism about possible worlds and many-worlds quantum mechanics. By and large, there seems to have been an at least implicit consensus on the opinions expressed by Skyrms. To this date, most philosophers have not been convinced by Lewis’ arguments for realism about possible worlds, entirely based on alleged explanatory advantages afforded by the profuse multiplication of entities. As for the physics side, it is fair to say that the majority of people working in the field disagree with the many-worlds community, for essentially the same reason: other ways of solving the conceptual conundrums raised by quantum theory being available, surely increasing the number of existing concreta is something that can and should be avoided. In addition to this, an undeniable difference seems to exist between the sort of worlds postulated by Lewis, essentially constrained only by logical consistency, and the many worlds hypothesized on the basis of quantum theory, which are, obviously enough, restricted to those allowed by the laws of physics.

Against this historical and conceptual background, Birmingham-based philosopher Alastair Wilson has nonetheless taken up the Herculean task of putting modal realism and many-worlds quantum theory together into a coherent, unitary view of reality. The results of this effort have been presented in several papers in recent years, and are now assembled in this thought-provoking book. While, as we will see, questions remain, Wilson has no doubt managed to come up with ingenious new hypotheses and has proposed solutions to existing problems and, more generally, with a powerful new modal realist view. The resulting perspective will certainly be of interest in the coming years, especially for naturalistically inclined philosophers, demanding that metaphysical hypotheses be made as continuous with our best science as possible.

Since, of course, one could disagree with the contention that Everettian quantum mechanics (EQM) “appears to be the most natural way to understand contemporary quantum physics” (ix), Wilson wisely decides to take EQM for granted in the book. In a sense, the fundamental issue he deals with can be expressed in conditional terms: what can one say about the nature of modality if EQM is true? According to Wilson, while “no extant theory [of modality] is credible” (5), EQM provides the basis for a satisfactory reductive analysis of modality in physicalist terms. This, in turn, gives abductive support to the antecedent of the above conditional, that is, to EQM itself.

Moving to the more specific contents of the book, Wilson endorses a necessity-first approach, according to which certain facts are such that nothing grounds their necessity, and what is amenable to analysis is instead contingency. On this basis, in Chapter 1 Wilson undertakes a detailed discussion of the modal realist thesis he aims to defend. The basic tenets of the theory are: the idea that worlds do not overlap (‘diverging’ EQM); the identification of metaphysical possibility with physical possibility—possible worlds, obviously enough, being identified with Everettian worlds; an indexical conception of actuality; a view of contingent propositions as sets of worlds; and the claim that objective chance is analysable in terms of the ‘quantum weights’ of sets of worlds. Wilson also specifies that he endorses ‘Individualism’, the view that the Everettian multiverse is a complex of possible worlds rather than a possible world.

One important problem for Lewis-style realism is represented by ‘advanced modalizing’: that is, by modal claims about things other than canonical, spatio-temporal entities. In particular, what should the realist say about the modal status of the pluriverse itself? Wilson proposes an account of possibility and necessity operators based on functions from individuals in the pluriverse to individuals in the pluriverse (‘counterpairings’, 38). Counterpairings, argues Wilson, allow one to make sense of the relevant linguistic entities while retaining the attractive S5 system of modal logic. Specifically, modal claims about the pluriverse are reduced to non-modal statements, in the sense that they are true simpliciter—i.e., non-contingently—of the multiverse. One wonders whether this is enough, however. Later, (Chapter 6) Wilson suggests that EQM can account for the idea of variation of physical parameters across different worlds and, more generally, contingency can be reconstructed as emergent. But what about a multiverse based on completely different laws from those of quantum mechanics? Prima facie, this seems to be a genuine possibility—as acknowledged also by authors who share Wilson’s belief that the fundamental notion of necessity is truth in all physically possible worlds (for instance, Leeds 2007). Consider Lee Smolin’s theory of ‘cosmological natural selection’ (Smolin 1992), which Wilson explicitly mentions as allowing for changes in the values of physical magnitudes. As a matter of fact, Smolin’s view arguably entails more than that, postulating physical laws that evolve as more and more universes come to life inside black holes of other universes. To be sure, one could simply reject the claim that certain modal claims pick out genuine possibilities or, alternatively, offer some tailor-made treatment of such claims. Nonetheless, those who are not independently convinced by the proposed modal realism may legitimately wonder at this point whether the sort of necessitarianism embraced by Wilson is truly part of the overall best explanation of reality or, to the contrary, it licenses a modus tollens against quantum modal realism. (On a side note, Wilson’s claim that on his approach conceivability becomes a perfectly acceptable natural property in the form of ‘being conceived in some Everett world’ (64) is not particularly helpful: how are we to establish whether something is conceived ‘somewhere’?)

In Chapter 2, Wilson presents in more detail his understanding of EQM. Crucially, the problem of individuating a set of physical quantities with respect to which individual worlds are distinguished from each other (the ‘problem of the preferred basis’) is solved by having recourse to so-called ‘decoherence’. That is, by invoking physical processes that are demonstrably such that quantum systems naturally evolve so as to eliminate indeterminacy at a sufficiently macroscopic level. The key point is, Wilson explains, that decoherence can be shown to systematically pick out the required physical basis. Everett worlds are consequently to be conceived as emergent portions of reality “grounded in the universal state”, the latter being “the fundamental entity of EQM” (80–81; here, Wilson surely meant to say that the physical system described by the universal quantum state is fundamental). In connection with this, another important choice that Wilson makes is endorsing the view that Everett worlds do not overlap and exist instead in parallel. In this context, the unique pre-branching world is replaced by sets of worlds sharing the same history (the abovementioned ‘divergent’ approach to EQM). This, Wilson claims, grants several advantages. First and foremost, we can make sense of statements about the future and future-directed probabilities—something that, claims Wilson echoing Lewis, is hard if not together impossible in overlapping EQM since, given a unique mereological sum of all worlds sharing the same story up to the relevant instant, all possibilities are realized relative to it.

In Chapter 3 Wilson takes on the important task of analysing the nature of chance and explaining how subjective credences of agents converge towards objective probabilities as determined by Everett worlds. After providing some sophisticated arguments in favour of indexicalism about actuality, Wilson shows that branch weights in EQM satisfy all the criteria that one may set for a measure of objective chance. In connection to this, we are presented with the ‘Everettian Principal Principle’ (138), which basically states that any rational credence function sets an agent’s credence in a proposition based on the evidence available at a given time t as equal to the proportion of Everett worlds that match the agent’s world up to t and in which the proposition is true. This is a remarkable result that, after many years of debate about probability in EQM, definitely endows supporters of EQM with a significant additional tool.

Chapter 4 is devoted to laws of nature. According to Wilson, it is a fundamental law of nature that all Fs are Gs if and only if Fs are Gs in all Everett worlds. This analysis allegedly unifies the strengths of Humean and non-Humean views: it is arguably genuinely explanatory, yet it does not invoke anything over and above what is in principle empirically accessible. This is interesting and to some extent plausible, but a few doubts remain. First of all, while Wilson’s proposal satisfies certain naturalistic methodological desiderata, surely one who is not persuaded by EQM in the first place may nonetheless object that it does contain some ‘metaphysically spooky’ elements after all. Indeed, that there is a plurality of worlds beyond our own is at best indirectly abductively inferred, exactly as it happens, say, for necessarily coexisting universals within Armstrong’s theory of laws. On the other hand, to the extent that laws are entirely analysed in terms of what is the case, albeit in the multiverse and not just in the actual world, rather than constituting a third way between Humeanism and non-Humeanism the proposed view seems to qualify as essentially Humean in kind. (On a side note, I was puzzled here by the systematic use that Wilson made of the term ‘actual’ in the left-hand side of the relevant biconditionals, e.g., ‘It is a law that actual Fs are G iff all actual Fs are G’ (149). Regardless of one’s preferred account of laws, surely the definiens in a general characterization of laws of nature should not be restricted to what is actual).

Next, quantum modal realism turns out to lead us to modal necessitarianism about laws. In particular, the fundamental laws are, according to Wilson, the same in all worlds: they correspond to the way in which things simply are in the multiverse (recall the earlier discussion of advanced modalizing). Here, some additional, independent argument in favour of necessitarianism would have been welcome. One option in this sense could be to adopt something along the arguments in favour of the ‘necessitism’ put forward by Timothy Williamson (2013). Alternatively, one might endorse i) a form of priority monism (the view that the whole cosmos is fundamental, something that Wilson seems sympathetic with, as witnessed by what he says about the fundamentality of the universal state); and ii) the thesis that whatever thesis is true about the fundamental is necessarily true (along the lines of Schaffer 2010). From i) and ii) one may then be able to derive the necessity of the actual (multi)verse via the plausible assumption that the necessity of a conjunction (in this case, that there is one fundamental entity and that the entity is the whole cosmos) entails the necessity of its conjuncts.

Be this as it may, in Chapter 5 Wilson discusses indeterminacy and provides an outline of a precisificational account of indeterminacy according to which indeterminacy in world number and in the nature of the existing worlds is reduced to vagueness in fundamental reality. This links up nicely with recent work on ontic indeterminacy and the quantum domain and promises to spark even more discussion in the area. In this sense, issues about which it would be great to hear more from Wilson include the following: is indeterminacy at root a feature of reality or of our language? Is the limit of decoherence ontically vague, or is it just unknown/unknowable? Relatedly, how can it be that ‘fundamental reality remains perfectly precise?’ (180; what about contextuality and the Kochen-Specker theorem? More generally, what is the ontological profile of individual worlds in diverging EQM?).

Finally, in Chapter 6 Wilson talks about fine-tuning and anthropic reasoning. Following authors such as Ian Hacking, Wilson contends that merely postulating a multiverse with qualitative variation is not enough to resist the fine-tuning intuition in favour of the existence of an intelligent designer. However, he adds, if the assumption that a multiverse exists is independently motivated (for instance, based on the arguments proposed in this book), then we have higher-order evidence against the conclusion of the fine-tuning argument. More precisely, we may not have a ‘rebutting defeater’ against fine-tuning arguments, but we do have an ‘undercutting defeater’. This distinction, as well as the related discussion of the various kinds of multiverse, is again very interesting material that makes a significant contribution to one of the traditional areas of research at the boundary between physics and philosophy.

In conclusion, Wilson’s book is an outstanding piece of work which puts together philosophy of physics and metaphysics in an exemplary manner, keeping the discussion at a very high standard throughout. Given the originality and audacity of the theses put forward, it should not come as a surprise that several issues remain open to debate—for instance, the strengths and weaknesses of Wilson’s necessitist views. The proposed physicalist reduction of modality is itself something that is likely to determine rather contraposing reactions. To be sure, at any rate, future work on modality and/or the interpretation of quantum mechanics will have to deal with Wilson’s ambitious and innovative theses. Perhaps, pace Skyrms, in most possible worlds this will result in modal realism finally becoming a serious contender in the philosophy of modality, and quantum modal realism coming to be regarded as its most plausible scientifically-grounded formulation.


Hugh Everett III, “Relative State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics”, Review of Modern Physics, 29, (1957), 454–462.

Stephen Leeds, “Physical and metaphysical necessity”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 88 (2007), 458–485.

David Lewis, Counterfactuals, Harvard University Press, 1973.

David Lewis, On the Plurality of Worlds, Blackwell, 1986.

Christopher Menzel, “Possible Worlds”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward N. Zalta, 2021,

Jonathan, Schaffer, “Monism: The priority of the whole”, Philosophical Review, 119 (2010), 31–76.

Brian Skyrms, “Possible Worlds, Physics and Metaphysics”, Philosophical Studies, 30 (1976), 323–332.

Lee Smolin, “Did the Universe Evolve?”, Classical and Quantum Gravity, 9 (1992), 173–191.

Lev Vaidman, “Many-Worlds Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward N. Zalta, 2021,

Timothy Williamson, Modal Logic as Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2013.